Hegel on Hamann

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G. W. F. Hegel, Hegel on Hamann, Lisa Marie Anderson (ed., trans.), Northwestern University Press, 2008, 192pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810124912.

Reviewed by James Schmidt, Boston University


The item reviewed here is a translation of Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel's review of Friedrich Roth's edition of Hamann's collected works, originally published in two parts in Jahrbücher für wissenschaftliche Kritik towards the end of 1828. The translation of Hegel's review (along with seventeen pages of helpful editorial notes) occupies a little under half of the book. The translator has also provided two introductions: the first (pp. xiii-xix) is a brief discussion of the main concerns of the review, while the second (pp. xxi-xlii) focuses at greater length on "The Notion of Friendship in Hegel and Hamann." Also included are a translation of Hegel's notes on Hamann (p. 55) -- which offer a brief, but fascinating, glimpse of how Hegel sketched out the main points of his review -- and a bibliography of translations of Hamann's works as well as literature on Hegel, on Hamann, and on the topic of friendship.

While the difficulties of Hamann's texts are legendary, Hegel's review is one of his more lucid works (the style he employed when addressing a broader reading public differed markedly from that of his philosophical treatises) and the translation is generally quite readable and, for the most part, reliable. But there are a few mishaps. For instance, an unidiomatic translation of vorausschicken as "sending ahead" yields the rather peculiar result of having Hegel claim that, in distinguishing civil from ecclesiastical authority, Mendelssohn "sends Wolffian principles of natural law out ahead of his treatise" (p. 35). Since it is rather unlikely that Hegel thought that principles could be forwarded like baggage, it may be safer to assume that he used vorausschicken figuratively and was simply noting that Mendelssohn "presupposes" Wolffian principles. And a rather puzzling passage in which Hegel observes, in a discussion of Hamann's sudden decision to travel from Düsseldorf to Münster, that "a few tickets which seem relevant are not printed" (p. 52), makes a good deal more sense once it is recognized that in the early nineteenth century a Billette could also be what Germans today call a Zettel, which means that Hegel is observing that a few "notes" having to do with Hamann's preparation for travel were not printed (i.e., not included) in the Roth edition. But while errors like these may lead to some head-scratching among readers, they are hardly fatal. And no translator of Hegel ever emerges from the battle without a few scratches.

The attention devoted to the concept of friendship in the book's editorial apparatus does, however, seem a bit excessive and is probably not all that helpful to readers in clarifying what Hegel was doing in this peculiar text. Following up on Gwen Griffith Dickson's suggestion in Johann Georg Hamann's Relational Metacriticism (New York, 1995) that a key to understanding Hamann can be found in "the idea of the relationship," Anderson proposes to examine a "relationship which played an absolutely central role in Hamann's life and, as Hegel stresses, in the genesis and development of his authorship: friendship" (p. xxi). She explores four of the more important friendships in Hamann's life. The first, which culminated with the Socratic Memorabilia of 1759 (Hamann's first major work), involved his troubled relationship with his employer and mentor Christoph Berens and Immanuel Kant, to whom Berens turned, in the wake of Hamann's unexpected and enthusiastic embrace of evangelical Christianity, in hope of finding a way to return Hamann to the cause of Enlightenment. Kant's proposed remedy -- having Hamann translate a series of articles from the Encyclopédie -- was, as might be expected, rather ineffective (pp. xxxvi-xxx). The second friendship, which cast Hamann in the role of mentor to Kant's former pupil Johann Gottfried Herder, ended with disagreements -- spawned in part by mutual misunderstandings -- on the nature of language (pp. xxx-xxxii). Hamann's relationship with Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, though also marked by misunderstandings and recriminations, was somewhat less troubled, perhaps because the two remained fond of each other despite Jacobi's inability to comprehend what Hamann was saying (an inability that was hardly unique) and Hamann's firm conviction that, ultimately, Jacobi was incapable of understanding himself (pp. xxxii-xxxv). Hamann closed his life in the company of the circle that formed around the Princess Gallitzin in Münster and included the pedagogues Franz Friedrich Wilhelm von Fürstenberg and Bernhard Heinrich Overbert, the poet Leopold Stolberg, and the philosopher Frans Hemsterhuis. This group devoted itself to a program of personal culture that blended Catholic piety with German Pietism and pursued the sort of relentless introspection that Hegel associated with devotees of "the Beautiful Soul" (pp. xxxv-xl). Sadly, Hamann appears to have been only slightly less unhappy here than he was in any of his other relationships and planned to return to Jacobi's estate. But he fell ill on the day he was scheduled to leave and the next day -- as Hegel writes in a passage that reminds us that, when he wanted to, he could write clearly and elegantly -- "saw the peaceful and painless end of his besieged life" (p. 53).

Though the intent of the more substantial of Anderson's two introductions is to examine "the role that friendship plays not only in Hegel's review and Haman's life, but also in the thought of both men" (p. xxi), it is hardly evident that the notion of friendship plays much of a role in Hegel's work outside his review of Hamann. Anderson places particular emphasis on a passage from Hegel's Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion dating from the year before his Hamann review as evidence for Hegel's general views on friendship (p. xl). But the passage -- in which "friendship" is used interchangeably with "love" -- is concerned with the concept of the Trinity. Its point is that "the one" is a "wholly abstract unit" and that, just as friends and lovers must give up their particularity by immersing themselves in relations with others, so God passes over into otherness by becoming incarnate and then comes back to universality as the Holy Spirit.[1] Whatever its theological merits, it is hard to see how this discussion offers much of a basis for an account of friendship.

Unfortunately, there is rather little in Hegel's writings that offer much more in the way of a discussion of the notion. The most explicit accounts occur in two passages in the Nürnberg Philosophische Propädeutik (Philosophische Enzyklopädie für die Oberklasse §193 and Rechts-, Pflichten- und Religionslehre für die Unterklasse §67), but they are fleeting (amounting to a little under 150 words) and quite perfunctory. The term does turn up quite often in descriptions of the relationship between Jesus and his disciples in Hegel's early theological writings,[2] but it scarcely appears at all in the Phenomenology: the word is used only twice, and one of these occurrences is a footnote to Schiller's poem "Die Freundschaft." His lectures on the history of philosophy note the significance of the notion for classical Greek philosophers (Werke 18:347, 549; 19:223) and his lectures on the philosophy of history have a bit more to say about traditional notions of hospitality (Gastfreundschaft) and their revival in England in the eighteenth century (Werke 12:299, 537). The remaining references to friendship in Hegel's works are devoted to contrasting it to those affective relations that have tended, in the modern world, to supplant it, e.g., the account of the ideal of love in the Romantic movement in the Aesthetics (Werke 14:156) or the discussion in the Philosophy of Right of the possibility of bequeathing property to a "circle of friends," rather than to family members, a prospect that Hegel sees leading to a "breach of ethical obligations" (§179).

If friendship functions, in Anderson's words, as "a cornerstone of Hegel's text" (p. x), it is less because the notion was particularly important for Hegel than because Hegel seems to have thought that it was significant for Hamann and for his age. "Friendship," he observes, "was an important matter in the affairs of the scholars and literati of that time, as we see in the many correspondences which have since been printed" (p. 25). He may have been on to something here, but to assume that this passage indicates that friendship was a relationship that had much significance for his own thought would be a bit like assuming that an American tourist who comments, upon returning from a trip to Europe, "Europeans are crazy about the World Cup," is necessarily a soccer fan. But while Hegel's works contain little on friendship beyond the comments that appear in his review of Hamann, they have quite a bit to say about a relationship that may help to explain why friendship plays the role that it plays in his review: the relationship between reviewers and the books they review.

Neither of Anderson's introductions offers much information about the particular venue in which Hegel's review appeared: the place and date of publication are noted (p. xiii) and a footnote sends readers to the Suhrkamp edition of Hegel's Werke for a discussion of "Hegel's seminal role" in the journal's history (p. 57).[3] Published by Johann Friedrich Cotta -- the head of one of the period's most important publishing houses -- and managed by Eduard Gans -- probably the most skilled of Hegel's Berlin disciples -- the Yearbooks for Scientific Criticism represent the culmination of Hegel's long-standing desire to establish a journal that would introduce educated readers to the latest developments in philosophy. The approach Hegel favored in the Yearbooks represented an implicit repudiation of the more pugnacious style of reviewing he employed a quarter of a century earlier in the Critical Journal of Philosophy -- a joint venture with Schelling that, as he wrote at the time, employed an arsenal of "weapons" that included "cudgels, whips, and paddles."[4] The first sign of the shift away from this sort of criticism can be seen in the principles he laid out in 1807 for a proposed Journal of German Literature -- the earliest sketch of the project that would finally be realized with the Yearbooks. His 1807 text called for a less polemical stance, advising reviewers to resist the temptation "to be more clever than something that is already very clever" and, instead, to attempt to enter into the matter under investigation and "talk it over [durchgesprochen]" with the author (Werke 2:568, 571). Hegel's review of the third volume of Jacobi's works, published in 1817 in the Heidelberg Yearbooks (yet another of his publishing projects) (Werke 4:429-461), offers an example of what he seems to have had in mind and stands in sharp contrast to the polemics he directed at Jacobi in "Faith and Knowledge," his 1802 contribution to the Critical Journal of Philosophy. As Terry Pinkard notes, in 1802 Hegel characterized Jacobi's work as "a misunderstanding of what was at work in modern philosophy;" but by 1817 Jacobi had become "an important thinker" whose philosophy helped to lay the groundwork for Hegel's own work. Once an "opponent," Jacobi "was now seen as a precursor."[5]

It proved difficult, however, to apply such an approach to Hamann's works: the central message of Hegel's review is that Hamann's thought led nowhere. "We later ones must admire him as an original of his time," Hegel observed, but this admiration was tempered by the recognition that Hamann could not find a way to produce "true creations for the pleasure and satisfaction of his contemporaries and successors" (p. 43). Unable to write anything that could be regarded as "a book" (p. 31), Hamann left behind a body of writings that "are in need of a commentary … thicker in volume than the writings themselves" (p. 40). Readers acquainted with Hamanns Hauptschriften erklärt (Gütersloh, 1956-1963) -- volumes in which the commentary swamps the text -- will appreciate Hegel's prescience.

This "originality" helps explain why Hegel wound up immersing himself in the details of Hamann's "besieged life," a concern that -- as Anderson notes (p. 57) -- is absent from his 1817 review of Jacobi. The rationale for the peculiar treatment accorded Hamann may, once again, have more to do Hegel's sense of what reviewers should be doing rather than with any particular interest that he might have had in the notion of friendship itself. His 1807 guidelines had pondered what to do in those cases when a work "proves interesting through the novelty of its content and does not yet permit any real judgment." He advised that in such cases a reviewer should offer a straightforward "historical presentation of its content" (Werke 2: 568). While Hamann's writings may not, strictly speaking, have been new, they were certainly "original" enough to thwart any attempt at an overall judgment. Hegel's discussion was, as Anderson notes (p. xiv), rather selective. It is unclear how much of the Roth edition he actually read and the aspects of Hamann's work that are of most interest to present-day readers -- for example, his discussion of language -- receive remarkably short shrift (see, for example, Hegel's dismissive handling of Hamann's critique of Kant on p. 37). But, for all of its shortcomings, the review does provide readers with a sense of the overall shape of Hamann's career as a writer and of his peculiar place in the history of philosophy. As Hegel saw it, Hamann shared this much with Jacobi: his thought represented an attempt to break free of the restrictions of the German Enlightenment (pp. 5, 30). But, because Hamann was unable to move "beyond the thinking of an abstract hatred towards the Enlightenment" (p. 32), all that he could do was to speak "at large and at random, against thought and reason in general" (p. 39). Which meant that -- in contrast to Jacobi -- Hamann was not one of those authors with whom a reviewer could "talk things over."

In a letter dating from the autumn of 1826, Hegel's long-time friend Friedrich Immanuel Niethammer had expressed the hope that a review of Hamann's writings might help resolve the misunderstandings that had plagued attempts to clarify the relationship between philosophy and history. Niethammer conceded that this would not be an easy task: when compared to his contemporaries, it would be hard to deny that Hamann was a "visionary [Seher]." But the present age, which looks askance at visionaries, "understands him as little as his own." The time was ripe, Niethammer wrote, for someone to remove "the cataract" that had blinded both Hamann's contemporaries and his successors to the true value of his writings.[6] While Niethammer was confident that Hegel was the man for the job, Hegel's notes show that, by the time he started to sketch out his plans for the review, he was resigned to producing a review of a different sort from the one his friend was anticipating. Hamann, Hegel noted, was "stuck, so to speak, in friendship, i.e., direction toward detail" (p. 55). Faced with a thinker who remained trapped in the concerns of an earlier age, all that Hegel could do was sketch the outlines of a "novel of friendship" in which "mutual incomprehensibility" (pp. 47-48) would be the order of the day.

The fact that Hegel had little use for Hamann doesn't mean that he didn't find him interesting. In a letter dating from the end of 1830 Hegel thanked his Königsberg disciple Karl Friedrich Ferdinand Sietze for a collection of anecdotes he had sent recounting Hamann's relationship with Kant. He noted that "if Königsbergers were Englishmen collections of this sort would have appeared in print long ago" and suggested that perhaps Sietze -- who, Hegel observed, had a good sense of humor and some time on his hands -- should devote some of his "horis subsecivis [leisure hours]" to putting together just such a volume.[7] Not the least of the virtues of Hegel on Hamann is that it offers readers a glimpse of how a thinker we do not normally think of as having much of a sense of humor spent a few of his leisure hours.

[1] Hegel, Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion (Berkeley and Los Angeles, 1988), 427-8.

[2] See, for example, G. W. F. Hegel, Werke in zwanzig Bände (Frankfurt, 1970), I:127-9 (hereafter: Werke).

[3] Readers desiring an English-language account of Hegel's role in founding the journal and his life-long interest in journals and reviewing should consult Terry Pinkard's excellent discussion in Hegel: A Biography (Cambridge, 2000), pp. 160-169, 233-236, 238-255, 384-388, 530-541, 453-456.

[4] Hegel, Briefe (Hamburg, 1952), I:65

[5] Pinkard 388.

[6] Hegel, Briefe III:145-6

[7] Hegel, Briefe III:324.