Hegel on Philosophy in History

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Rachel Zuckert and James Kreines (eds.), Hegel on Philosophy in History, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 260pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107093416.

Reviewed by Kristin Gjesdal, Temple University


This volume, published to honor the work of Robert Pippin, includes contributions by an impressive range of German and Anglophone scholars: John McDowell, Sally Sedgwick, Ludwig Siep, Paul Redding, Robert Stern, Terry Pinkard, Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Karl Ameriks, Christoph Menke, Axel Honneth, Jay Bernstein, Slavoj Žižek, and Jonathan Lear. The volume addresses central topics in Hegel's work as well as debates in recent Hegel scholarship, most often (but by no means exclusively) with reference to Pippin's work. Attention is paid both to the limits and nature of subjectivity (autonomy, self-consciousness, self-legislation, recognition, spontaneity) and to the nature of the modern project -- i.e., key topics in Pippin's work, whether in his early study of Kant's theory of form, his seminal interpretation of German Idealism in Hegel's Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness (1989), or his later work on Hegel's aesthetics, practical philosophy, and beyond. In fact, it would be no exaggeration to claim that it is precisely these aspects of Pippin's work that enabled him -- through a career of more than four decades and an oeuvre that spans not only all the main proponents of German Idealism, but also Nietzsche, film, literature, and art -- to spearhead a transformation of Hegel scholarship.  Pippin did this by extracting from Hegel's work a series of topics and themes that communicate with concerns within contemporary philosophy, thus serving, in effect, to undermine disciplinary parochialism, such as the barriers between continental and analytic philosophy and between systematic and historical scholarship. In the following, I will provide a brief overview of the contributions to this volume and then offer some reflections on what questions remain in its wake.

"Philosophy and History in Hegel," the volume's Part One, contains contributions by John McDowell, Sally Sedgwick, and Ludwig Siep. The (friendly) disagreement between Pippin and McDowell goes back a good decade or more. Drawing on the Aristotelian reverberations of Hegel's idealism, McDowell's opening chapter discusses Pippin's "two cheers for nature" approach. He questions Pippin's interpretation of Geist as a socio-historical achievement and defends, instead, a semi-naturalized version of Hegelianism. This version of Hegelianism, though, can still emphasize the centrality of rational self-reflection in Hegel's account. In McDowell's view, we can thus "reject the idea that being a rational subject is the result of an exercise of autonomy without failing to respect the Kantian thought that rationality requires avoiding dogmatism" (p. 21).

Sedgwick is, strangely, the only woman contributing to the volume (the bibliography only strengthens the sense that the discipline needs to change in this respect). In her contribution, Sedgwick plays out a different kind of interanimation with the work of Pippin. She seeks to carve out a fundamental sense of historicity in Hegel's work -- one that grants Hegel a will to see his own system within a concrete historical context, while, all the same, offering a different kind of limitation to Hegel's rationalism than we find in the work of McDowell. On Sedgwick's reading, Hegel's philosophy, even his Logic, is marked by traces of historical contingency (and, as she puts it, possibly also further forms of contingency). Hegel is taken to defend an epistemic modesty in that he "does not take himself to establish -- or be able to establish -- that its [The Science of Logic's] thought-forms and the system to which they belong are valid once and for all" (p. 49).

Siep's chapter rounds off Part One with a discussion of how Hegel's philosophy seeks to be both inside and outside of history and culture. According to Siep, one of the things contemporary philosophers can learn from Hegel is that to give up "the pretense to an external standpoint overseeing the general direction of cultural history" need not amount to an abandonment of the project of modernity itself (p. 67). For Siep, the project of modernity, and of critical reasoning, can also be pursued from within cultural life. While Siep does not explicitly discuss Pippin's position, one can imagine him seeking to stay true to Pippin's commitment to the modern project (Robert Stern, Karl Ameriks, and Jay Bernstein also pay due attention to this dimension of Pippin's work), while also asking whether his emphasis on the deliberating powers of subjectivity is, at times, too optimistic.

Presented under the heading of "Hegel and Before," Part Two turns to Hegel's history of philosophy and his conception of philosophy as a historical practice. Paul Redding offers a provocative reading of the master and slave dialectic, emphasizing its roots in Greek Stoicism and its relationship to Aristotelian philosophy. This, in turn, opens a more comprehensive discussion of how the insights of the master and slave section of the Phenomenology extend to Hegel's logic. For Redding's Hegel, reflection represents a merging of theoretical and practical attitudes, thus drawing on -- but also pointing beyond -- the limits of Aristotelian (and Leibnizian) logic. Aristotle is also a central point of reference in Robert Stern's discussion of Hegelian perfectionism. Indicating a possible mediation between the positions defended by McDowell and Pippin, Stern argues that Hegel has a perfectionist philosophy, but that this is indeed of a distinctively post-Kantian kind (see pp. 91, 98, 103 etc.). This, it seems, is but another way of addressing the question as to where the commitments to Kantian transcendentalism end and the historical-dynamical commitments to post-Kantian idealism take over.

A different approach to Hegel's naturalism is found in Terry Pinkard's contribution. Seeking to combine a softer, Aristotelian naturalism with a Kantian emphasis on autonomy, Pinkard presents a version of developmental naturalism in which Hegel's:

own conception of what it means to become better practical reasoners is at odds with a purely 'species life' conception. As the irrationalities of a failing way of life make themselves felt, agents move beyond merely conceiving of themselves as responding to reasons and develop conceptions of what reasons they are authorized to take up in action (p. 119).

Rolf-Peter Horstmann defends an interpretation of Hegel that, at least to this reader, appears incompatible with that of Pippin. Seeking to analyze and revoke what he sees as a general tendency to valorize Kant over Hegel (on the grounds of Kant's distinction between metaphysics and epistemology), Horstmann offers a more generous reading of what he considers to be the irreducibly metaphysical tenets of Hegel's philosophy. In Horstmann's view, acknowledging the metaphysical commitments at work in Hegel is not, as it is sometimes thought, a recipe for failure. In his intertwinement of metaphysic and logic, Hegel is thought to steer clear of "erroneous beliefs about the nature of concepts and objects and  . . .  unfounded claims as to the nature of the soul, the world, and God" (p. 136).

In a different vein, Karl Ameriks seeks to question a dominant historical narrative, though this time it is a narrative that is, by and large, established by Hegel himself -- namely that of the constitutive shortcomings of philosophical romanticism. While romantic philosophy has not received much attention in Pippin's work, Ameriks suggests that it instantiates the late modern perspective that he finds in Pippin's work. In this way, Ameriks airs the legitimate concern that "even non-imperialist readings of Hegel -- whatever their advantages -- may still tend, at times, to obscure the value of non-Hegelian late modern positions and may needlessly encourage the common presumption that these positions are distinguished by a kind of subjectivism, aestheticism, or historicism" (p. 145). He proposes, in other words, that Hegel's philosophizing on history should also invite us to reassess his work in history, including the way in which his reading of the history of philosophy reflects his own polemical agenda.

Under the heading "Hegel and After," Part Three contains contributions by Christoph Menke, Axel Honneth, Jay Bernstein, Slavoj Žižek, and Jonathan Lear. Menke questions the reading of Hegel as a straight-forward philosopher of autonomy (in the Kantian tradition) and presents a dialectical reading through which Hegel's philosophy allows us to realize that the concept of second nature cannot serve to ease the gap between nature and spirit, but rather reintroduces nature in a new form. From his point of view, history emerges not as a progressive path towards freedom and self-determination but as driven by power struggles of the kinds we find more aptly analyzed in the works of Marx and Nietzsche.

Honneth, whose debates with Pippin have a long history, contributes a chapter defending -- against Isaiah Berlin's two concepts of liberty -- a concept of (social) freedom, one that not only draws on, but also significantly goes beyond Hegel by appealing to the works of Marx, Arendt, Dewey, and others. At stake is an alternative in which "others are not experienced, as in the usual case, as limitations, but rather as conditions of the possibility of forming and realizing our own intentions" (p. 191).

The perspective of Critical Theory, this time a generation back (with Adorno figuring large), is also present in the contributions by Bernstein and Žižek. While Bernstein discusses the Hegelian approach to the amphibian problem, cast as "Kant's radical dualism between autonomous subject and determined natural object, between rational freedom and material nature" (p. 193), Žižek addresses Hegel's notions of art and late modernity, thus bringing in a topic that, while a crucial part of Pippin's work, is by and large absent from the volume.

In the final chapter, Lear pleads for a revision of Hegel's understanding of self-consciousness along Freudian lines, arguing, as he puts it, that "a contemporary Hegelian ought also to be a Freudian. Not a Freudian as that term is commonly understood, but someone willing to develop Freud's inheritance as it ought to be received" (p. 239). With its reflections on the role of the professor in the modern university, Lear's chapter nicely brings into perspective how Pippin, with his refusal of narrow disciplinary categories, continues the idealists' own commitment to a philosophizing that is animated through encounters with literature and the arts.

While the line-up of contributors is impressive and the overall quality of the chapters is high, the topic of the present volume is at one and the same time somewhat narrow and not quite spelled out to its full potential. Consisting of a panel of fairly senior contributors, many of whom have been engaged in past exchanges with Pippin, one cannot help wondering what traces his work has left among a younger generation of philosophers. As I see it, the real legacy of his work will not simply be summed up by those with whom he has spent his career conversing, but also by his paving the way for new generations of Hegel scholars. From this point of view, I am probably not alone in that I would have welcomed contributions not only by the volume's two editors, both of whom are strong scholars in their own right, but also by other, younger philosophers who are doing solid work on German Idealism.

More significant, though, is perhaps a concern about how the volume sets up the very topic of philosophy in history. For although many of the contributors, directly or indirectly, are critical in their approaches -- a peculiarly philosophical way of paying homage -- there are also scholars who have offered less congenial concerns about Pippin's reading of Hegel, especially his approach to Hegel's metaphysics, sometimes labeling his reading as "deflationary" or "sanitized." Some of the concerns have, precisely, to do with what is perceived as an unwillingness on Pippin's part to see Hegel's work as situated in history and thus, as a result, as being marked by his own time and period -- sometimes in ways that are difficult for us to accept or even make sense of. It would have made sense to invite a few more critical readers and to have Pippin himself respond to the concerns discussed, be they launched from within a position that is compatible with his own or not.

Pippin has definitely been a primus motor behind the recent upsurge both in Hegel scholarship and European philosophy more broadly. The present volume corroborates one strand of this influence, yet leaves the broader scope of his work unaddressed. While Hegel's Idealism did indeed open up Hegel and German Idealism to a generation of readers, many of its readers have also found inspiration in Pippin's willingness to practice philosophy in an old-world style -- as engaging a larger field of human culture. Pippin's contributions to aesthetics, for example, deserves merit and attention not only because this is, after all, one of the ways in which he stands forth as a Hegel scholar of distinction, but also because it bears witness to the legacy of German Idealism at its best.