Hegel on Political Identity: Patriotism, Nationality, Cosmopolitanism

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Lydia L. Moland, Hegel on Political Identity: Patriotism, Nationality, Cosmopolitanism, Northwestern University Press, 2011, 223pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810127418.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Church, University of Houston


G.W.F. Hegel fascinates many political philosophers because he synthesizes political aims long thought to be in conflict with one another -- rights and duties, identity and difference, individuality and community. Yet on one issue, namely, the persisting tension between nationalism and cosmopolitanism -- a tension that has erupted into political upheaval and violence in Europe in recent months -- the nation-state-centric Hegel seems unfortunately to come down squarely on one side. In her insightful and timely book, Lydia Moland argues that Hegel rather ought to be understood as a defender of national identity tempered by cosmopolitan ethical principles and institutions. Shifting deftly between textual analysis and contemporary application, Hegel on Political Identity makes a strong case for Hegel's relevance to contemporary attempts to reconcile patriotism and cosmopolitanism.

In making her case, Moland challenges the traditional way of reading Hegel's distinction between "objective spirit" -- the sphere of political right and "ethical life" -- and "absolute spirit" -- the sphere of universal human self-reflection in art, religion, and philosophy. Scholars tend to argue either that absolute spirit has nothing to do with the independently developing objective spirit, or the universal perspective transcends that of the parochial political perspective. Instead, Moland brings out the several ways in which these spheres are separable yet interdependent in Hegel's texts. The "particular" devotion to a national way of life fuels our attachment to abstract "universal" principles instantiated in the modern state and in cosmopolitan norms and institutions. In turn, the modern state and international norms cultivate a reflective citizenry that can shape a national way of life so that it fits with these principles.

The difficulty Moland's interpretation faces is that Hegel says very little about the relationship between objective and absolute spirit, and so several of her conclusions require inferring Hegelian views from Hegelian principles. In interpreting Hegel, Moland eschews the practice of cleaving scrupulously to Hegel's views. Instead, she defends an "open" Hegelian system in which she deploys Hegelian principles sometimes against Hegel himself (e.g., on his views about the necessity of war for the ethical health of states). This interpretive approach invites certain challenges -- I'll suggest one below -- but overall Moland makes a persuasive case.

To summarize the argument: Moland understands Hegel's central concern to be finding the conditions for individuals to become autonomous agents. An agent does not achieve freedom through a process of abstraction from her desires, as for Kant. Rather, an individual becomes free "through her desires," specifically by molding "her desires in such a way that she can reflectively endorse them" (17). For Hegel, Moland argues, an individual achieves this ability to mold and reflect on desires through relationships of mutual recognition with others, in which the individual shapes her desires to help pursue common purposes the individual shares with others. Only through ethical participation in institutions of the family, estates and corporations, and the state can individuals develop the reflectiveness to make their otherwise arbitrary desires their own. By focusing on the conditions for autonomous agency in chapters 1 and 2, Moland follows recent non-metaphysical interpreters of Hegel's practical philosophy such as Terry Pinkard and Robert Pippin. This interpretation has become quite influential in Hegel scholarship in the last twenty years as it provides a philosophically compelling theory of action and normativity that is social or "intersubjective" in nature and avoids the dangers of abstract Kantian rigorism on the one hand and relativism on the other.

With this interpretive approach, Moland turns in chapter 2 to Hegel's theory of the state. She challenges the received view of Hegel that the "state" is a monolith incorporating everything from cultural mores to legal institutions within it. Instead, she claims, Hegel distinguishes patriotic support for the state from the affection a member feels for one's nation. She substantiates her claim with a careful textual study and an illuminating historical contextualization of the changing meaning of "patriotism" in the European Enlightenment era. In his lectures on The Philosophy of Right, Moland argues, Hegel shifts between two meanings of "patriotism" he gleaned from the age -- a traditional German "patriotism" expressed in local philanthropic associations, which Hegel appropriates in his discussion of corporations, and a British sense of patriotism for the rational institutions of government, which is compatible with a critical stance towards existing government if it fails to carry out its rationally ordained function. Moland hence argues that Hegel does not support what would become the destructive form of "patriotism" in nineteenth-century Germany, that of the chauvinist nationalism that puts one's nation above all others (48-51). Though Moland provides a much needed historical context, she has difficulty explaining some of Hegel's uses of "patriotism" in which he suggests that citizens also have patriotism for the customs, mores, and cultural meanings and goods that make up a "nation" (77, 191n2).

By contrast to this largely reflective "patriotism" for rational state institutions, Moland argues in chapter 3, Hegel juxtaposes the affection for and membership in national ways of life and culture, what Hegel calls a "Volksgeist." To elaborate on the relationship between nation and state in Hegel, Moland examines Hegel's notion of the "Volk als Staat" (usually translated as "nation-state") in the lectures on The Philosophy of History. According to Hegel, Moland claims, nations that follow the proper path develop self-reflection in the form of newspapers and public dialogue, yet this reflection becomes complete only when a nation creates rational state institutions to shape the people's desires (83, 89). Accordingly, state and nation have an interdependent relationship -- the nation fuels members' desires to support the state, whereas state patriotism cultivates rational reflection on one's desires.

In chapters 4 and 5, Moland extends this insightful "interdependence thesis" further and suggests that "absolute spirit" helps rationalize national identity for Hegel. These are exciting chapters, because most Hegel scholars either ignore Hegel's reflections on world history or think that absolute spirit is irrelevant to or transcends politics in the form of art, religion, and philosophy. Moland argues that the crucial point of Hegel's philosophy of history is often obscured by Hegel's implausibly strong teleological view of history and the unfortunate things Hegel says about places like Africa and the "Oriental World" (115). The crucial point is that Hegel's Philosophy of History establishes the freedom of all individual agents as the universal standard against which all nations ought to be judged. Thus, world history provides a cosmopolitan perspective from which to evaluate one's own national identity and hence to reflectively shape and endorse it. Furthermore, Moland argues that Hegel's views of art, religion, and philosophy, rather than being beyond state and nation, can help perfect them. Even in modernity, art can bring self-reflection to a nation's people, as Moland demonstrates through an analysis of Hegel's lectures on aesthetics (particularly interesting here is a short section on Hegel's reading of Friedrich Schiller's plays The Robbers and Wallenstein, 137-141). Philosophy, for Moland's Hegel, apprehends universal rational principles and also discerns how these principles can be applied in the particular nation and state.

In the final chapter, Moland applies Hegelian principles to the contemporary world, one quite different than the world Hegel was used to. She argues that if Hegel were alive in our day, he would not be the state-obsessed philosopher he is often taken to be, but rather would be a robust defender of cosmopolitanism. Moland argues that Hegel's distinction between nation and state means that Hegel need not demand a homogenous national identity to support the state, but rather that a multicultural society in which each culture supports rational state institutions is compatible with Hegel's view (155). Also, she contends, Hegel would argue that the globalization of the market or "civil society" has created ethical responsibilities on the part of citizens to all human beings, especially those impoverished by the vicissitudes of the global market. Moland contends that Hegel would be a proponent of some contemporary proposals to ameliorate world poverty, such as ethical consumer activity, micro-loans, and international trade unions (171-2). For Moland, Hegel would encourage a cosmopolitan ethical life, a global ethical community that would not undermine but could help improve our own national ethical life.

Moland's book contains many insightful readings of Hegel and creative extensions of his theories. It makes a powerful case for Hegel's synthesis of patriotism and cosmopolitanism. Yet ultimately I worry Moland may have given us a too-idealistic and too-Kantian Hegel, thereby missing some of Hegel's skepticism about the cosmopolitan project.

Moland's Hegel appears Kantian almost from the beginning, when she argues that freedom means that we can "reflectively endorse" our desires (17). Hegel certainly defended reflection as integral to human freedom, but Hegel also thought that ethical action is fundamental to "earning" or making inherited ethical determinations our own. Hegel thought of action as akin to labor, as a human activity that helps create a human world that invests meaning and value to human actions and events (on this point I think Hegel follows John Locke's insight that by investing my labor on something, I transform that thing in accordance with my own self and thereby make that thing my own). In many passages of The Philosophy of Right, Hegel even speaks of the institutions of public life as the results of human "work" (see, for instance, Moland's citations on her pages 55, 56, 85). By focusing on a reflective form of autonomy, Moland downplays this self-determining form. As a result, she exaggerates the critical distance state institutions can achieve toward national character, missing the ways in which Hegel characterizes state institutions and laws as expressions of national self-determination.

I'm skeptical, then, that reflection can play the tempering role Moland wants it to. I also worry that Moland puts more weight on the capacity of human reflection to motivate ethical action than Hegel does, especially when it comes to an "ethical cosmopolitanism." For Hegel, modern individuals take interest in ethical actions only when it serves their self-interest, which is why Hegel thinks philanthropy is not a real solution to the problem of poverty and instead he looks for structural solutions that would draw on, rather than encourage the transcendence of, self-interest. The problem with an "ethical cosmopolitanism" is that there is  no structural solution available, and so any kind of cosmopolitan ethical action would be of the reflective, philanthropic type, such as ethical consumer activity or microloans. "International trade unions," by contrast, Hegel might worry about since they are not circumscribed by a world government and so might devolve into the "miserable guild system" Hegel bemoaned in his day (172).

Hegel would, I think, be more pessimistic about "ethical cosmopolitanism" than Moland thinks. This isn't to say that Hegel wouldn't recognize the kind of cosmopolitan moral claims Moland points to -- he does -- but it is to say that I'm not convinced that Hegel would think reflection can play the shaping role in the identity and ethical behavior of average citizens in the way Moland wants it to do. Rather than giving politics or philosophy this task, Hegel would be more likely to look to religion to serve the cosmopolitan ethical ideals Moland points toward.

Though ultimately Moland does not offer a convincing case that Hegel can be marshaled to reconcile nationalism and cosmopolitanism, nonetheless she has written an excellent, thoughtful, engaging book, a "must-read" for scholars of Hegel's political philosophy. I applaud her efforts to make Hegel relevant to the contemporary world, since his wisdom about modern life should be shared not only among Hegel experts, but with all modern citizens.