Hegel on Self-Consciousness: Desire and Death in the Phenomenology of Spirit

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Robert B. Pippin, Hegel on Self-Consciousness: Desire and Death in the Phenomenology of Spirit, Princeton University Press, 2011, 103pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691148519.

Reviewed by Michael Inwood, Trinity College, Oxford


Hegel's account of self-consciousness in chapter IV of his Phenomenology of Spirit is the most influential, and perhaps the most insightful, passage in his works. Yet, like Plato's allegory of the cave, it seems to point in too many directions to allow a consensus about its meaning. In this book, Robert Pippin produces an interpretation that attempts to accommodate all the elements in Hegel's engaging narrative: desire, life, encounter with another self-consciousness, struggle to the death, and recognition. Hegel is commonly supposed to be giving a quasi-Hobbesian account of the transition from a state of nature to a state of society. But Pippin's Hegel begins where Kant left off.

Kant had argued that the conceptual contribution that we make to our sensory input enables us to be more than the sentient perceivers that animals supposedly are and to make perceptual judgements about objective states of affairs. We humans can stand back from our representations, make judgements based on them, and wonder whether they are really veridical. Similarly, we can stand back from our desires and emotions and ask whether they are appropriate and justifiable. We are 'self-conscious' creatures, not simply absorbed in our current passing state of consciousness. Because of this we advance claims about putatively objective states of affairs. But to make such claims, Pippin argues, is to claim an authority or entitlement to do so, and this claim needs to be justified. This is why Hegel introduces other self-conscious creatures, who were neglected by Kant in his theoretical philosophy, though not in his practical philosophy. One's authority to advance objective claims needs to be recognised or acknowledged by another self-conscious being; the claims themselves must be supported by reasons presented to the other self-consciousness and defended against their challenges, defended, if need be, to the death. Hegel is more aware than Kant that a self-conscious being is an embodied living creature as well as a bare 'I think', but it must be willing to risk the loss of its biological life in the defence of its objective authority.

Perhaps the sociality of human beings cannot bear as much weight as Pippin's Hegel imposes on it. After all, non-human animals, from bees to baboons, are also social animals, but they are not elevated to self-consciousness by this fact. It will do little for one's self-consciousness if one tries to defend one's authority against an alligator or a gorilla. The encountered other must already be a self-conscious creature before it can do its job, and the first self-conscious creature must recognise it (though not necessarily acknowledge it) as self-conscious if it is to interact with it in the appropriate way and not simply regard it as a meal, a pet, or an obstacle in its path. (In fact the readiness to act with it in such a way is itself a form of acknowledgement.) Hegel's story seems to presuppose the existence and recognition of a self-conscious being and cannot therefore fully explain the emergence of self-consciousness. The most we can say is that human sociality, the encounter with another self-consciousness, is a necessary condition of self-consciousness, that there could not be only one isolated self-conscious creature, unless it were endowed with an imaginative power that we do not in fact possess.

Another difficulty for Hegel is his insistence that the self-conscious creature should be ready to fight to the death. Pippin tries to help him out in a variety of ways. Sometimes the combatants are implied to be fighting over scarce resources (74n.), though scarcity is not mentioned in the text and is unlikely to be a problem if there are only two self-conscious beings around. Elsewhere Pippin says that they fight because there are as yet no established rules for deciding what counts as a good reason for a belief or a course of action (83). The problem of 'equipollence', the encounter with someone who holds different views from one's own and refuses to be convinced by any reasons one advances, is no doubt unsettling and the simplest solution to it is to kill one's obstreperous opponent. Some people may well have found this an attractive solution to their epistemological problems. But who in their right mind would adopt it if it involved a serious risk of their own death? Pippin's Hegel also says that a self-conscious creature is not excessively attached to its biological life and wants to display its distance from it (38, 79). Biological life may not be everything, but it is a necessary condition of any other sort of life, including self-consciousness itself. So why not agree to live and let live, and simply move on to a more compliant opponent?

Pippin's Hegel also seems to exaggerate the importance of giving reasons for one's beliefs and conduct, especially in view of his disparaging remarks about 'Räsonnement', even in the Preface to the Phenomenology, but more particularly in later works. One can give reasons for almost anything, he says, and such reasons are never conclusive. What matters are not 'reasons' (Grűnde), but 'reason' (Vernunft). Whatever we might think about this, Pippin certainly seems to indulge in hyperbole when, having said that one does not know what one is doing or what one believes 'by observation … or by inference from observation', he continues:

Likewise, 'knowing' what you are now doing would make no sense to you, would not be knowledge, unless the activity also seemed explicable; knowing what you are about involves knowing why you are about it, and so involves what you take to be the reasons you are doing it. Likewise, knowing what you believe involves knowing why you take something to be true, what you take to be reasons for believing it. No one, that is, 'just' believes something or 'just' does something. (54-5)

The latter claims are surely not entailed by the proposition that knowing what I do or believe is not based on observation. I know where my left leg is, but not by observation. Its being in that position may seem 'explicable' to me, but I do not know what the explanation is, nor am I aware of any particular reason for its being in that position rather than somewhere else. 'What I am doing (or did) makes no sense to me' does not entail 'Knowing what I am doing (or did) makes no sense to me'. Moreover, the claims look false. When I am asked to pick a card, I have a reason for picking some card or other, but not usually for picking the card I do pick. (Sometimes the success of the trick depends on my not knowing why I pick that particular card.) Quite often, I have said or done something, apparently for no reason. I may have had a reason, but not one of which I was aware either at the time or afterwards. But Pippin's Hegel does not need to claim that a self-conscious being never does or believes anything without a reason of which it is aware. It is enough for him if a self-conscious creature sometimes, or perhaps mostly, knows of reasons for its actions and beliefs.

Whatever the merits of the view Pippin attributes to Hegel, this still leaves open the question whether Hegel actually holds this view, and in particular whether he expresses it in this chapter. Pippin's interpretations often fit Hegel's text rather loosely. Hegel says, for example, that 'consciousness is for itself its concept, and as a result it immediately goes beyond the restriction, and, since this restriction belongs to itself, it goes beyond itself too'. This, Pippin tells us, is a 'defense of the claim that consciousness must be understood as apperceptive' and means that

the normative standards and proprieties at play in human consciousness are 'consciousness's own', that is, are followed by a subject, are not psychological, empirical laws of thought … This is [Hegel's] version of the Kantian principle that persons are subject to no law or norm other than ones they have subjected themselves to. (This is what is packed into the "for itself" here.) (22-3)

Who ever would have guessed it? And why pick on Hegel? If a philosophical doctrine is worthy of dissemination and acceptance, it should be able to stand on its own two feet and not need the imprimatur of an authority, such as Hegel, especially if he does not obviously endorse the doctrine, and perhaps obviously does not endorse it.

Pippin's book bears some of the scars of its origin in a course of lectures: repetitions, rhetorical flourishes, and flaccid argumentation. It is nevertheless a lively book, it is crammed with illuminating ideas, and it forcefully (and mercifully) resists the temptation to interpret the struggle for recognition allegorically, as a 'drama going on within one consciousness' (44). It will invigorate university courses for years to come, introducing students both to Hegel and to a respectable philosophical viewpoint, even if it leaves them wondering how the two fit together. It is a worthy combatant in the struggle to discover the secret of Hegel.