Hegel on the Modern Arts

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Benjamin Rutter, Hegel on the Modern Arts, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 282pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521114011.

Reviewed by Allen Speight, Boston University


Hegel's aesthetics has, especially since Henrich and Danto, often been viewed as heralding the "end of art." Those who have taken pains to look more carefully at the text of Hegel's Lectures on Fine Arts have rightly pointed out that Hegel's claims seem to be more precise than this -- that Hegel does not in fact declare the "end of art" in the sense of its death but rather insists that (in T. M. Knox's translation) "the form of art has ceased to be the supreme need of the spirit." The modern aesthetic issue of concern for an Hegelian then, presumably, is not a matter of art's ceasing to exist (although Hegel does sometimes make it sound as though he might think this is not an impossibility -- as for example, when he huffs that with the German poet Jean Paul "art actually ends"), but whether art can matter any longer for those of us who inhabit a modern, rationalistic and bourgeois age.

But those who have attempted to rescue a Hegel whose aesthetics might still be philosophically relevant for at least some of the significant developments in art and literature since his death in 1831 have not always taken up the broader philosophical question about how and why art can still matter (or even -- as is the bolder claim of this book -- be indispensable) for Hegel. And Hegel's defenders as well as his critics have also had the further limitation of resting their claims about what Hegel actually said in his lectures on what remains to this day an unclear textual basis. The most widely used published English version of Hegel's lectures on aesthetics is Knox's two-volume Hegel's Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art, but Knox relied on an edition prepared by Hegel's student H. G. Hotho, and contemporary scholars have been at pains to use the existing transcriptions of those lectures in an effort to pare off the authentic words of Hegel himself from the accretions of his disciple.

English-speaking philosophers interested in Hegel's various Berlin lecture series on topics in the philosophy of spirit have had access for years to good translations of the various Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, thanks to the editorial work of Jaeschke, Hodgson, and others, but there exists to this day no such opportunity for those interested in Hegel's aesthetics. (The situation is in fact worse than this, since not even all of the aesthetics lecture series transcripts have been published yet in German.)

One of the best features of Benjamin Rutter's new book on Hegel's aesthetics is that he has taken care to examine the development of Hegel's views about modern art over the series of lectures Hegel gave on the topic during the 1820s. The conclusions Rutter draws based on his textual work with the German transcripts of the lectures -- that Hegel, for example, was more pessimistic about art's role in modern life in the early part of that decade but tended to soften his views in the final lecture series -- are, moreover, importantly situated in the context of a fine-grained account of Hegel's treatment of various achievements within the artistic genres that he thought mattered most in modernity (certain forms of lyric poetry and Dutch genre painting, especially).

Another of this book's best features is precisely that it is concerned with Hegel's view of the modern arts -- the plural an apparent recognition of a failing to which (contemporary as well as historical) philosophers of art sometimes fall guilty, that of not going beyond the philosophical discussion of the significance of Art to an examination of the distinctive differences that inhere in artistic genres and their exemplars.

Rutter shapes his argument first by responding to the pessimistic stance about art's status as he sees it articulated in Henrich's dual claims that in the modern world art is necessarily partial (since it can no longer address all of our most important concerns) and redundant (since whatever insight a work of art might offer is presumably better comprehended philosophically). The first claim, he argues, is not inconsistent with a notion of modern art that is also indispensable (Hegel himself speaks of the notion of a "partial" satisfaction associated with works of art). The latter claim is more problematic, but Rutter finds that it rests (at least in the versions articulated by both Henrich and Danto, in his view) on an un-Hegelian distinction between content and form. Hegel does not think, after all, that beauty is something which is determined as content readily transportable between various artistic media; artists do not place into their works some separable "meaning" or previously arrived-at self-knowledge which is then executed in the work of art, but content and form are bound up with each other just as intention and action are for Hegel.

Further, the notion of "sublation" to which Henrich appeals needs to be contextually examined as well: on Rutter's view there is a distinction between the notion of sublation relevant within the philosophy of history (where the world spirit moves on from ancient Egypt or China, never to return) and the notion of sublation that pertains in Hegel's treatment of the ethical institutions of modern life (where the family is the first form of ethical life, but remains a significant moment within the larger scope of the state). This confusion is perhaps not surprising, given that Hegel's theory of art (not unproblematically) incorporates within it a theory of art's history -- a point nicely discussed by Rutter.

On Rutter's view, art's ultimate relation to philosophy is both cooperative (both are, after all, modes of Absolute Spirit for Hegel) and dependent (art still requires a superior kind of philosophical account-giving). As he puts it: the "generalistic" perspective of the philosopher can be consistent with the "eye-level" insight of the artist into "local" domains. Rutter doesn't quite explain what the definition of "locality" in this sense might be within the larger Hegelian philosophical project, but it is clear, if he is right, that it should be possible to give a "positive account of art's distinctive value," one that in Rutter's view has both instrumental and intrinsic value, since he sees art as both helping toward free and rational agency and being one kind of rational freedom itself. (If we could imagine in the future some form of practice that managed to present life's oppositions to the senses as reconciled it just would be art, or what art has come to mean.)

Art's "local" character means that it has within modern life something of a niche status: if rational satisfaction (in love, work, and political life) is characteristic of modern bourgeois life, according to Hegel, art might well be able to take up the individual's concern with everyday disappointment in these areas, thereby avoiding the powerful pull of the Romantics' yearning or Sehnsucht for a brighter, golden age. Art in the modern age may have the purpose of "repairing rather than rejecting" such disappointments, of engaging issues that "seem least suited to the abstractions of philosophy and therefore only loosely integrated into the picture of modern life as reconciled and free." So "what is left to artists is what is left out of institutions: the small chores, the family strife, the bootless careers, the unrequited loves" (p. 105). These concerns are above all the province of the dominant post-Romantic modes of art -- genre painting and lyric poetry -- and provide the kind of solace a wayward Hegelian disciple might be unable to discover merely by reading Hegel's Encyclopedia.

For Hegel, beauty is found classically in the harmony between form and content characteristic of Greek sculpture, but in a modern medium like Dutch genre painting, what characterizes art is a certain liveliness rather than beauty and a sort of absorption -- not in the objects represented (a scene of pipe smokers) but rather in everydayness in general. As Hegel puts it in one of the lectures, what is set before us in such paintings is "a way of acting that is more general than [an] action itself." The task of the romantic arts is thus "to see the present itself as it is -- even at the cost of sacrificing beauty and ideality of content and appearance -- as a present liveliness recreated by art" (p. 110).

This notion of absorption leads ultimately to an account of the subjectivity of the artist himself:

Hegel's idea is not so much that the painter makes pictures of people who are themselves absorbed … it is that he makes pictures of people doing anything whatever, and then points with such commitment and intensity that his own exemplary self-unity … simply forces us to see the painted subject as absorbed (p. 100).

Such a view of the absorptive elements in the painting of bourgeois scenes may give a sense -- not just for the artist but for the bourgeois, as well -- that "affirmation and investment offer a way out."

Such a view of modern art, Rutter argues, would not have led Hegel to be a champion of the banal (Norman Rockwell), nor does it put aside the evil or base in bourgeois life from artistic representation. The "solution" of the Dutch painters on the matter of representing the low and the base is to treat it comically (not satirically). Rutter connects this response more thematically in the book as a whole to a distinction that he sees both in Hegel and in the contemporary literary critic James Wood between two forms of comic representation -- a gentler comedy of forgiveness (which Hegel of course associated with the large vision not of any modern comic artist but of Aristophanes) and a comedy of correction (which Hegel actually linked to Molière).

It is in lyric poetry that Hegel seems to find the most promise for the post-romantic arts, but for him the demands of lyric "interiority," with its stress on the experience of "the heart," have "nothing to do … with sentimentality or with indulgence in 'feeling' for its own sake" (p. 179). The important lyric concern, from the perspective of Hegel's philosophy of art, is the key Hegelian notion of reconciliation, which Rutter construes along the lines of Dutch painting's sense of "absorption" as an "immediately felt sense of investment in one's world, and thus the 'heart's deeper immersion in the object'" (p. 179). Hegel's concern is thus with how lyric can be both intimate and universal, helping to clarify or objectify emotions (thus not freeing the individual of passions in a Kantian way but allowing the individual somehow to be free in them).

As he examines Hegel's broader reconciliatory interests in modern poetry and literature -- his praise, for example, of Sterne's "true" or "objective" humor in opposition to the "subjective" humor he castigates in Jean Paul -- Rutter offers a close reading of some of the poetic works which Hegel praised most highly (but which, like Goethe's West-östlicher Divan, may be known to Germanists but probably to few philosophers, Hegelians included).

On the whole, Rutter's "niche" view of art's role in modernity gives us a self-consciously modest Hegelian claim about what it is that art can do of significance in the cultural world we inhabit. Rutter acknowledges the bolder recent stance of Robert Pippin, who, in writing on Coetzee, for example, has claimed what Rutter calls a constitutive role for literature in Hegel's philosophical work, on which literature is not merely mined for examples of norms but "as criterial aspects of just what it could be to espouse or avow" a particular value (p. 62, n. 27). The more modest path which Rutter defends may thus leave aside some of the larger questions that Hegel clearly thinks works of literature, especially, provoke us to ask about the historical path we have taken to arrive at modernity and its significance. (The longer story here has to do not only with shifts in the template of Western social norms -- why we come to make claims that appeal to the notion of conscience, for example -- but also in how the practices and institutions of the West led to the formation of a certain new view of art and aesthetics starting in the early eighteenth century. In this sense, an interesting companion piece to Rutter's treament of Hegel on the modern arts is Kristeller's oft-cited essay on the "System of the Modern Arts," which makes clear just how much any account of the nineteenth-century context of Hegelian aesthetics must owe to an examination of the eighteenth and preceding centuries -- the development of fine arts academies, as opposed to mechanical arts guilds, the emergence of a philosophical way of linking several genres, the emergence of the post-Kantian trinity of the true, the good, and the beautiful, etc.)

It also needs to be said that Hegel's philosophical stance toward art in modernity -- as well as the use he makes of literature and other artistic products in his own work -- is not always the same: it would be useful to connect Rutter's careful study of the development of Hegel's view of romantic/post-romantic art over the course of the 1820s with the shifts that occur from the formation of his Jena aesthetics forward. (As Rutter points out, the Phenomenology of Spirit makes use both of works that Hegel continues to admire in Berlin as world-historically important, but it also picks up -- in a manner not unknown to some of his Romantic rivals -- the more epiphenomenal literary notes sounded in review articles and works that are now quite obscure. But the Phenomenology's task with respect to literature is, after all, the presentation of a central historical moment and what leads up to it, so the 'gallery of pictures' of which Hegel speaks has a frequently different inflection when it comes to literary works and images than do the Berlin lecture series.)

The contribution to this larger conversation about art and modernity made by Rutter's book, however, is a significant one. His is without question one of the most scholarly informed and literarily sensitive books on Hegel's aesthetics to be published in the last decade or so, and it is to be hoped that it will spur further work on Hegel's philosophy of art.