Hegel on the Proofs and the Personhood of God: Studies in Hegel's Logic and Philosophy of Religion

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Robert R. Williams, Hegel on the Proofs and the Personhood of God: Studies in Hegel's Logic and Philosophy of Religion, Oxford University Press, 2017, 352pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198795223.

Reviewed by Nicholas Adams, University of Birmingham


This is a book for those interested in the intricacies of Hegel's philosophy of religion. It asks and answers two questions: how can Hegel's accounts of the proofs for God's existence best be understood; in what sense is Hegel's God 'personal'?

The study is split into two halves named in the title. The first part, chapters 1 to 3, treats Hegel's handling of the proofs for God's existence, principally in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion (which contains Hegel's defence of Anselm against Kant) and the Lectures on the Proofs for the Existence of God (published for the first time in English in 2007 in a translation by Peter Hodgson). The second part investigates whether and in what sense God is personal, focusing on the Logic and the Philosophy of Right for an elaboration of the category Persönlichkeit and then focusing on the Logic (alternating between Science of Logic the Encyclopedia Logic) for discussion of the personhood of the absolute idea, followed by the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion for the personhood of absolute spirit.

In relation to the proofs for God's existence, Williams makes two main points. The first is that Hegel uses his treatment of the proofs as elaboration of his deeper account of the relation between thinking and being, and uses that deeper account as a proof of God's existence. The second is that in Hegel's hands the role of such proofs is less a matter of establishing a claim (e.g. 'God exists') and more a contribution to an older tradition of elevating the soul to God. Each can be taken in turn.

The importance of Hegel's account of the relation between thinking and being is, Williams claims, its non-dualism. Kant looms large in this account. In his critique of what he calls the 'ontological' proof, Kant is a species of dualist in so far as he affirms the separateness of being (or existence) and thinking (or ideas). The problem with the ontological argument, for Kant, as is well known, is that it proceeds from the idea of God to the existence of God. For Kant, in common with many modern philosophers, such procession must go in the opposite direction: 'reflection' names the journey from experience to ideas, including the big theological three of the soul, the world, and God. Such ideas operate regulatively and it is the purpose of the transcendental dialectic to diagnose those errors when the ideal (a matter of thinking) is confused with the real (a matter of being). In Williams' interpretation, Hegel rejects this not only because it is dualist, but also because it is a deficient variety of scepticism (30-37). Kant is sceptical about ideas (they are produced) but not about impressions or the moral law (they are given): on the latter, Kant is 'dogmatic'. For Hegel sceptics are dogmatic (about scepticism) and Kant the dogmatist (about impressions) is sceptical (about ideas). Hegel's alternative is to refuse a privileging of either thinking over being or a privileging of being over thinking. The 'rational' is the unity of thinking and being, of the produced and the given, of freedom and necessity, of subject and object. This is all rehearsed elegantly by Williams with detailed support from the relevant texts.

The ontological proof displays this unity. Kant makes the mistake, according to Hegel, of thinking that the proof attempts magically to pluck existence out of the concept. For Hegel, this view presupposes something other than a unity of thinking and being: if they are a unity then there is no question of plucking of any kind. Being is not absent from thinking such that it needs to be added to or plucked out of it. Williams points out that Hegel knew Anselm, unlike Kant who largely engages with Descartes' version of the ontological argument (100). This is significant: for Descartes (in Williams' exposition of Hegel) God is the sum total of all realities (102) which is, for Hegel, to lace the infinite with finitude. By contrast, for Anselm, for Hegel, for Williams, God is truly infinite. God surpasses realities ('all' or otherwise) and is certainly not arrived at by stringing them together ('infinitely' or otherwise).

The theme of elevation is one of the most suggestive parts of the book. Williams suggests that, for Hegel, part of the point of the proofs for God's existence is to explore commitments to ideas that do not depend on humans 'postulating' anything (58). In the proofs God is not a postulate: God exists. Hegel objects that, for Kant, the job of postulates is to help us know things: they are instruments rather than being things that can be known. But what is so special about things, such that even God is a mere instrument in the service of our knowledge of them? Hegel insists that the proofs for God's existence are a quite reasonable endeavour for those who seek to know God, and not just know things. This knowledge is not the knowledge of another thing (for God is not a thing) but a matter of 'the ascent of spirit to God' (62).

It is a great strength of Williams' account that the key issue in the discussion of elevation of spirit, and Hegel's critique of Kant's description of God as a postulate, has at its core the question of whether proofs for God's existence are more about God or about humanity. (In this respect the proofs have much in common with discussions of prayer: is it about God's acts, or about our acts; is the goal change in the world brought about by God, or change in our desires brought about by the discipline of prayer?) Do the proofs have as their focus God who is known, or is the focus a change in our knowledge or even a transformation of our minds? Hegel criticises Kant for making God a postulate of reason on the two grounds that a postulating is a human act (it privileges human action) and it produces an infinity which merely extends finitude without end (it is not true infinity). To be elevated is to have to do with a unity of immediacy and mediation, and a unity of finite and infinite. Williams describes this clearly and persuasively.

Williams does an excellent job, in some detail, of showing that Hegel's discussions of God unfold as a series of relations between infinity and finitude, necessity and freedom, immediate and mediate, unity and difference. He shows that these pairs of terms are treated by Hegel as belonging together: Hegel, for Williams, shows the contradictions that follow from dualistic treatments of these terms and insists that the pairs form in each case a unity. This is the distinctive character of Hegel's logic and is strikingly different from common-sense logics (which are typically dualist). Williams repeats Hegel's claims, with a strong emphasis on their non-dualist (even anti-dualist) character, although he makes no attempt to defend them against critics (theological or philosophical).

The second part, chapters 4 to 6, treat the personhood of God. If one affirms that Hegel's discussion of God is a matter of logic, and of such terms as infinity, necessity, and unity, it is still not clear in what sense this God is 'personal'. This is admittedly not a matter peculiar to Hegel: it was a question frequently raised by Pietists in the face of the seemingly abstract categories found in academic theology. Hegel is nonetheless an exceptionally challenging case.

Whatever personhood turns out to be in Hegel, it is in large part a matter of clarifying technical philosophical terms. Williams points out that the issue of God's personhood is at stake in the disagreements between 'left-Hegelians' and 'right-Hegelians' in the decades immediately after Hegel's death. The left-Hegelians were not concerned to defend God at all, personal or not. The right-Hegelians sought to defend the idea of God as a cosmic monarch, removed from the world. Williams (relying on detailed analyses by Walter Jaeschke and Stephen Houlgate) argues persuasively that both parties deny Hegel's plain claim (in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion) that philosophy and theology have the same object, and both parties end up denying the personhood of God (if for seemingly opposite reasons).

Williams offers an historical account of what he calls a 'center Hegelian position', that of Karl Ludwig Michelet (1801-1893), the editor of Hegel's lectures on the history of philosophy (and one of the editors of the complete works of Hegel), and author of two works on the personhood of God. Williams offers a summary of Michelet's own views on divine personhood (158-168). For Michelet the fundamental issues are eternity and immortality: how can God, as eternal, be personal; and how can humans, as persons, become immortal? This involves discussion of infinity and finitude, especially in the context of the incarnation. This is followed by a commentary on Hegel's account of personhood principally in Science of Logic, Encyclopedia Logic, and Philosophy of Right (168-188). Hegel in Philosophy of Right is concerned with the fact that what makes a person unique is their difference from everything else (the person as unique subject), along with the fact that what makes a person describable is what they share with others (the person as bearer of shareable predicates). For Hegel a 'person' holds together the contradiction of being completely unlike and yet like others. Williams further discusses the centrality for Hegel of freedom (175ff) and of recognition (180ff).

This general discussion is followed by detailed textual commentary on the personhood of the absolute in the Science of Logic and the personhood of absolute spirit in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Williams acknowledges that Hegel treats personhood in works as diverse as the Logic, the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion and Philosophy of Right and asks the obvious question: how are these different treatments related (192)? The answer is that the 'true infinite' unites them. Williams suggests that whether one can offer a convincing account of Hegel's discussion of personhood is a test of whether one has understood Hegel. He condemns not only left-Hegelians and right-Hegelians (whose one-sidedness Williams has already repaired through an account of Michelet) but also non-metaphysical interpretations of Hegel (which he criticises as a Kantian tendency to make epistemology primary and ontology secondary). This is exceptionally interesting: Williams challenges non-metaphysical interpreters to offer a convincing account of Hegel's handling of personhood. Williams offers his own, in which the themes of teleology and organism play a major role, and in which Hegel's distinctive approach to questions of 'abstract' and 'concrete' concepts takes centre-stage. To state it briefly: personhood is tied to concreteness and singularity, but in such a way that singularity and absoluteness are not a duality but a unity, and in such a way that universal, particular and singular are not three concepts but three moments of one concept (216-217). The absolute idea in the Logic is personal not because it is a person; it is personal because it does not negate determinations but somehow contains them (228).

In the case of absolute spirit, in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, it is the refusal of dualism between infinite and finite that underlies the personhood of God. If one accords personhood only to finite individuals, and if one takes God to be both infinite and absolute, then God will appear impersonal. But Hegel takes God to be a unity of infinite and finite. He also takes God's subjectivity to include particularity. He thus insists that his account preserves in a philosophical register the common-sense religious claim that God is personal (232-234). Again, to follow Hegel's train of thought one must learn his handling of 'abstract' and 'concrete' (roughly: that in contrast to many philosophical accounts, for Hegel the later, more developed categories in logic are less abstract and more concrete, 240-241). Williams ends his study with a confrontation of Hegel's privileging of the language of Geist: where the long Christian trinitarian tradition speaks of relations between persons, and a shared being, Hegel speaks much more intensely and emphatically about spirit, and in such a way that speech about father and son is muted and arguably left behind in later sections of the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Williams locates the personhood of God, for Hegel, above all in the personhood of spirit and Hegel's handling of the concept of community (265ff). The final pages are a fascinating unpacking of the following dense claim: 'Universal singularity is the concept of subjectivity, personhood, and freedom that Hegel affirms of God as triune because it includes the requisite conditions of concrete universality, non-coercive, affirmative mediation, and self-recognition in other' (267). Things perhaps get a bit rushed towards the end, with discussions of evil and of kenosis (both complex topics in Hegel and in the wild) struggling for oxygen in summaries of one or two pages each. The study closes with a defence of Hegel against Kantians. Unlike Kant, who insists we can only speak of the human relation to God, Hegel insists on a mutual relation: his is an account of God's self-determination and self-communication, not an account of purely human autonomy (278ff). This is worked out in an affirmation of human particularity because particularity is preserved in the concept of God (295), in accounts of the community as 'in' God (287) and in an account of God 'as' community (302).

Williams' study clarifies and exemplifies what is most generative and what is most frustrating in Hegel's thought. When Hegel uses terms like 'necessity' or 'personhood' (Persönlichkeit) he does not mean what is typically meant (either in everyday usage or in the usage of other philosophers). Hegel certainly does not make up new and eccentric meanings for these terms: he engages with their existing usages, explores the contradictions that they produce, and proposes usages that address those contradictions. But to criticise Hegel one must nevertheless learn to use his terms to answer the questions he poses. This brings us to the practical implications of a study of this kind. Once one grasps what kind of discussion Hegel is engaged in, what then?

Williams' account is appreciative of and positive about Hegel's discussions in both cases (the proofs, and the concept of personhood), and is reasoned out of Hegel's texts. But whose misconceptions about Hegel are being corrected here? There is a well-developed twentieth century theological literature on Hegel, from Barth and Balthasar, through Küng, Jüngel, Pannenberg and Moltmann in the 1970s and 80s, to Desmond, Hodgson, O'Regan and Shanks over the last twenty years. Some of this is highly critical (Desmond highlights Hegel's refusal of transcendence; O'Regan paints a portrait of Hegel 'misremembering' the Christian tradition); some is more positive (Hodgson sees in Hegel resources for a liberal modern theology; Shanks finds in Hegel a framework for radical openness to difference). There are also studies of Hegel on the trinity (Dale Schlitt, Samuel Powell) and of the significance of Hegel's ethics and politics for religious plurality (Thomas Lewis, Molly Farneth) and many others. More proximately to Williams' concerns, there is discussion of logic in relation to God (Burbidge, Houlgate, di Giovanni, Adams). The meaning of God in all these accounts is central. Williams is, however, not much concerned to converse with these interpreters and their work, nor to address the debates in which Hegel's significance for contemporary religious thought arises. Put more positively, this is a study of Hegel's texts, analogous to a commentary, which for the most part does not get distracted by how others read them. Put more critically, if one wishes to reopen theological questions about Hegel, the reader must do nearly all the work. Williams offers no help for reconsidering the (highly influential) work of O'Regan, for example. Likewise, if one wishes to understand Hegel's proximity to or distance from the long theological tradition (and the questions it poses when 'proving' God's existence), that is entirely up to the reader.

One can take the obvious example of 'person' language. This language has a long history, and an engagement with the long tradition is unavoidable if one wishes to situate Hegel vis à vis contemporary discussions. The account of personhood (Persönlichkeit) is certainly of interest to theologians who engage with debates around trinitarian thought. It is an area of some complexity because of the proliferation of Greek and Latin terms. For the Greek-speaking pro-Nicene Eastern theologians (i.e. those who were committed to the full divinity of the Son and the Spirit), there is one something (ousia, physis, hypokeimenon) shared by three somethings (prosopon, hypostasis), which differ in their mutual relations, but do not differ with respect to the 'one something'. There is often a degree of looseness and negotiation over these terms because they are put to work in a somewhat ad hoc fashion, to answer new questions. For the early Western pro-Nicene theologians, thinking in Latin, there is likewise one something (esse, substantia, subiectum) shared by three somethings (persona, suppositum) and again there is some interchangeability of terms in each case. There were anxieties on the Latin side in which -- simplifying greatly -- there was awareness that in Greek philosophy 'ousia' and 'hypostasis' are sometimes interchangeable terms, whereas in trinitarian theology they are and must be quite distinct. For the Latin writers, the aim is typically to articulate the grammar that governs worshipping Father, Son and Spirit as divine while denying division in God. Later on, Aquinas notes (ST 1a, 30, 1, repl obj 1) that the concept 'persona' in certain cases overlaps with that of 'substance' (especially in Aristotelian talk of different substances) and he warns that talk of 'three substances' would be deeply confusing for trinitarian thinking if 'substance' can translate both 'ousia' ('being of one substance -- homoousion, consubstantialem - with the Father') and 'hypostasis' ('the three persons of the Trinity'), even though this would not be wrong Aristotelian usage.

It is against this backdrop that those with an interest in the history of the concept of God approach the question of God's personhood in Hegel. How is Hegel's talk of subjects and substances to be mapped on to classical debates about the equivocation of such terms as hypostasis (interchangeable with ousia or with propsopon, according to context) and substantia (interchangeable with esse and persona, according to context)? In what sense is God subject, and in what sense personal? Williams displays little interest or familiarity with questions of this kind in his discussion of the trinity in Hegel (248-254), and although he does later ask the question, is Hegel a modalist? (257-261), the discussion is largely about Plato and Aristotle, not about pro-Nicene grammars. Williams offers insufficient help to those who wish to gauge the amplitude of Hegel's approximation to or from the long tradition's use of the concept of God (especially his handling of the trinity). Rather the emphasis is on defending the personhood of God quite independently of any of the actual debates about personhood in the long theological tradition. Williams says casually of the long tradition that the 'traditional holy spirit' is 'one of the least developed aspects of classical Christian theology, close to being the veneration of an abstraction' (302). The implication is that one cannot compare Hegel's sophisticated thinking with something so rudimentary. This is disappointing.

The index is thin. Very few of the figures discussed in the footnotes are listed and this makes it difficult to discover how Hegel is interpreted by Barth or Jüngel (or others), or to judge how the current study relates to them. Given the importance of gauging Williams' claims about Hegel against those made by previous readers, it is worth repairing this defect:

Adams Wiliams Lucida

Finally, it is striking to consider who Hegel's conversation partners are in this account. The only other philosophers to receive serious consideration are Spinoza and Kant. Works by Jacobi, Fichte, and Schleiermacher show up in the select bibliography, but there is little discussion of them. Schelling and Hölderlin, two contemporaries of Hegel who had a lot to say about God, are wholly invisible.

This is a detailed and competent study of Hegel's texts. But theology and philosophy are disciplines engaged in conversation: and in the end Hegel cannot here escape a kind of intellectual quarantine. He remains imprisoned in the 1820s, doomed to correct Spinoza and Kant for eternity, and -- with the honourable exception of Michelet -- never to engage his theological successors.