Hegel or Spinoza

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Pierre Macherey, Hegel or Spinoza, Susan M. Ruddick (tr.)University of Minnesota Press, 2011, 264pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816677405.

Reviewed by Caroline Williams, Queen Mary, University of London


This is a most timely translation of Pierre Macherey's 1979 work Hegel ou Spinoza. Indeed, Macherey's meticulous undoing of Hegel's reading of Spinoza, in order to expose a deeper connection between the two philosophies, nicely accentuates some of the tensions framing recent discussions within contemporary continental political philosophy, where the perceived merits, and precise political utility, of Hegel and Spinoza's philosophy continue to be debated. For example, on the one hand, Alain Badiou and Slavoj Žižek continue to frame and enrich their own notions of contradiction, or destruction, with recourse to Hegel's philosophy; whilst, on the other hand, Gilles Deleuze and Antonio Negri have drawn heavily on Spinoza (over Hegel) to develop an immanentist account of the political that has no room for negativity. New readers of this translation of Macherey's text may find in it many reiterations of contemporary discussions and, perhaps, a way to revisit, from a 'new' angle, some of the themes and concepts presented there.

But Macherey's French text likewise had important theoretical effects upon the philosophical scene in France when it was originally published in 1979. It solidified, in many respects, a sense of the over-riding concerns of French structuralism, in general, and of post-1968 Marxist thought, in particular. For the radical wing of these philosophic-political movements, which also sought to influence the policy of the PCF, the many returns to Hegel initiated by phenomenology and existentialism had failed, in their view, to challenge adequately the teleological view of history, and the deep humanism underlying Hegel's thought. In their groundbreaking, symptomatic reading of Marx, Lire le Capital (1965), Louis Althusser, Etienne Balibar, Pierre Macherey, Jacques Rancière, and Roger Establet, revisited these dominant facets of Hegel's thought, with a new focus upon the conjunctural historical analysis necessary to a critique of contemporary capitalism, and the anti-humanist character of Marx's thought -- and, indeed, of any critical theory of politics and philosophy. Many of these interventions began in the 'Groupe Spinoza' set up by Althusser in 1966, and whose membership included Badiou and Macherey. Badiou later assessed his debts to Spinoza, and critiqued the ontological basis of Spinoza's thought; Macherey published over a number of years a five-volume study of Spinoza's Ethics. In both cases, it is fair to say that Spinoza infiltrated their respective philosophical approaches and arguably had a lasting influence. For the 'Groupe Spinoza' in the 1960's, not only was Spinoza's philosophy viewed as a necessary 'detour' to clarify Marx's relation to Hegel (Althusser, 1973, 134), but Hegel's own relation to Spinoza was also deemed worthy of close analysis for its own contribution to Marxist theory.

It is precisely this task that Macherey sets himself in Hegel or Spinoza, although the tone of the work is largely philosophical rather than political. But the book is clearly much more than a pitting of Spinoza against Hegel: it is an exercise in the activity of philosophical thinking itself. As Macherey writes in the introduction to the second edition of the book,

philosophy is something that moves, that passes, and that takes place, in a place where the connection between thoughts gestates, which, in the works themselves, escapes the specific historical conditions of their authors' undertakings, and the understanding of this process diminishes the interest we might extend to their systematic intentions, because this process grasps them dynamically in the anonymous movement of a sort of collective project, appropriating a given philosophy to the ensemble of philosophy and not only to one or other among them (p.3-4).

Later, he will understand this interpretative process as the 'philosophical actuality' of a work (Macherey, 1998, pp.125-135). In this sense, if Macherey is interested in the intersection of, and confrontation between, the respective philosophies of Hegel and Spinoza, he is primarily interested in the philosophical space between the two, where the names Hegel and Spinoza give rise to a 'suspended truth' (p.6), a new philosophical object encountered through contestation and critique. Spinoza famously used the Latin term sive to indicate the systematic identity or equivalence between two things (i.e. Deus, sive Natura). Macherey does the same here in the title of his book, suggesting it be translated as Hegel vel (sive) Spinoza (p.5), thereby expanding the boundaries of engagement, and forcing the philosophical space between Hegel and Spinoza where something new may emerge.

Hegel or Spinoza is, therefore, a rich, engaging, and carefully constructed philosophical work that offers its readers nuanced readings of Spinoza and Hegel. (Macherey's deliberate inversion of chronology is important here since his arguments reveal the paradoxical Spinozism of some of Hegel's positions.) The book also carefully derives some of the Althusserian arguments for understanding history as a 'process without a subject or goal' and concludes with a speculative discussion about the theoretical contours of a materialist dialectic (also pursued by Althusser, in For Marx). In developing this philosophical dynamic of reading Spinoza in Hegel, which is never simply a deconstruction of one reading or another, Macherey reveals to his readers that Hegel is closest to Spinoza when he tries hardest to distance himself from him: Hegel's refusal of Spinoza's philosophy 'has the value of a symptom, and indicates the obstinate presence of a common project' (p.11).

Macherey commences his philosophical analysis with a critical reading of Hegel's own (mis)reading of Spinoza, most particularly his conception of the absolute, which for Hegel lacks the very notion of beginning, and hence remains immobile, static, formal, without Life, or real finite expression, subjectivity, or historical (dialectical) movement. Hegel's criticisms, mostly developed in the Science of Logic and his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, are well-known, not least his claim that Spinoza's philosophy lacks a critical moment of negativity (a point rearticulated most recently by Žižek (2003)). Macherey's reading is very much in the style of the symptomatic form adopted of Marx by Althusser in Lire le Capital, and of Freud by Lacan in the Écrits. He argues that Spinoza's philosophy of substance requires no notion of subject, or negativity, to drive itself forward, and that his critique of teleology, together with the very productivity of his concept of causa sui give rise to a dynamic concept of substance. Hegel might have thought that Spinoza was not dialectical enough, Macherey speculates, but what if, in practice, his thought was too dialectical? (p.12)

Parts of this argument (Chapter 3 of the book 'The Problem of Attributes') have already been made available to an Anglophone readership in Montag and Stolze (eds.) The New Spinoza (1998). But this key, highly influential discussion pervades the broader arguments of the book too, particularly chapter 4 'Omnis Determinatio Est Negatio'. Here, Macherey shows how Spinoza's system cannot be exhausted by the oppositions Hegel places upon it. Hegel views Spinoza's measured and purely rational usage of negation as eliciting a too formal, and restrictive meaning, being associated solely with those finite modes, which have a determined existence (and can, therefore, contain contradiction or difference), but not with substance itself, which remains resolutely positive and expansive (p.115-17): Spinoza's philosophy cannot conceive the negation of the negation or, therefore, the very movement of life and matter. Indeed, it is this emptying out of negativity that leaves Spinoza's substance lifeless and detached from the experience, and knowledge, of the lively world of being.

Macherey presents a quite different structure for the 'passage' of Spinoza's substance. (For a careful comparison of his and Deleuze's interpretation of Spinoza, readers may find Duffy (2006) helpful). There are not two (Kantian) orders of reality - the infinite and the finite, or the world of essences and the world of existences -- but a single, complex reality 'continuous and indivisible' (p.201). Thus:

Substance does not precede its modes or lie behind their apparent reality, as a metaphysical foundation or a rational condition, but, in its absolute immanence, it is nothing other than the act of expressing itself immediately in all its modes, an act that is not itself determined through the relations of modes to each other but that is to the contrary their effective cause (p.200).

Spinoza's philosophy, Macherey argues, does not, therefore, require a subject, or consciousness, to figure as the logical moment of negativity, the genesis of history, or the local pattern of a knowledge, however embodied this subject might be. Indeed, Macherey positions Hegel and Spinoza in close proximity here, since neither configures a logic of the subject. What might be named subject, by Hegel, can only 'express itself in the totality of its process' (p.203). For Spinoza, the only place for the subject is as 'a relation between existences' (p.201).  His philosophy better describes a physics of being as individual (conceived in a broad, pre-modern sense -- See Ethics II Propositions 13): 'a certain assemblage of elements of the same nature that agree among themselves . . . in terms of their existence' (p.175).

However, whilst Hegel's process-like formulation is compromised, in the last instance, by his evolutionism, there nonetheless remains something within his notion of infinity that draws him closer to Spinoza, for whom eternity escapes duration and 'coincides with its infinite existence in act' (p.209). Spinoza's eternity is 'the absence of end' and it thus 'refutes a teleological interpretation of the act' (p.210). This kind of interpretation, which to some degree conjoins Hegel and Spinoza, is critical to Macherey's final speculations, since it forces him to begin to think the question of the limit that separates an idealist dialectic from a materialist one. 'Under what conditions', Macherey asks, 'can a dialectic become materialist?' (p.213). Macherey does not completely answer this question in Hegel or Spinoza, but he does open up the space for thinking with Spinoza, a materialist dialectic without foundation or guarantee. Perhaps this mode of this final question also illustrates the historical specificity of Macherey's work, tied as it was to the Althusserian reconfiguration of a radical Marxist politics and philosophy. That this text has been reissued now, in Sue Ruddick's excellent translation and introduction, indicates that this question is as timely today as it was in the 1960's and 1970's.


Althusser, Louis, (1973) Essays in Self-Criticism, translated by Graham Lock, London: New Left Books.

Duffy, Simon (2006) The logic of expression: quality, quantity and intensity in Spinoza, Hegel and Deleuze, Aldershot: Ashgate.

Macherey, Pierre (1998) 'Spinoza's Philosophical Actuality (Heidegger, Adorno, Foucault)' in In a Materialist Way (translated by Ted Stolze), London and New York: Verso.

Macherey, Pierre (1997) 'The Problem of the Attributes' in Warren Montag and Ted Stolze (eds.), The New Spinoza, Minneapolis: Minnesota University Press.

Žižek, Slavoj (2003) Organs Without Bodies, London: Routledge.