Hegel's Concept of Action

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Quante, Michael, Hegel's Concept of Action, translated by Dean Moyar, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 216pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521826934.

Reviewed by Paul Redding, University of Sydney


In the "Preface" to this English translation of a book first published in German a decade ago, the author notes a change in recent philosophical culture bearing on the project he had undertaken in it. When he had first started working on the book there had been little if any interest in Hegel among analytic philosophers (including German-speaking ones), while orthodox Hegel scholars had generally thought that there was little to be gained by utilizing analytic approaches in their attempt to clarify and evaluate Hegel's claims. Quante's project, which relates Hegel's account of action to the sorts of analyses found in the influential approaches of analytic philosophers such as Elizabeth Anscombe and Donald Davidson, must have initially seemed a rather lonely one. Now, however, things must seem considerably brighter. In the year of its original publication, 1994, there appeared works by Robert Brandom (Making It Explicit) and John McDowell (Mind and World) which seemed to be concerned with opening up, from the English-speaking analytic side of the divide, the type of dialogue that Quante himself was calling for from the side of German Hegel scholarship. Given the widespread interest excited by those two books, Quante might now feel decidedly optimistic about finding a receptive audience.

Quante doesn't underestimate the difficulties involved in attempting any such reconciliation. Not only had Hegel relied on his own idiosyncratic analytic terminology, his analyses of action were embedded within a system supposedly grounded on a "logic" that seems to bear little relation to what is today known by that name. Indeed, according to a widely accepted account of its origins, analytic philosophy itself had been born from a critique, based on the results of the logical revolution of the later nineteenth century, of just those very "logical" principles to which Hegel had appealed in fashioning his system. The common assumption, however, that the analytic revolution established an irreconcilable divide separating subsequent philosophy from Hegel, may have to be seriously reassessed.

In unpacking the conceptual structure of the account of intentional action implicit in Hegel's treatment of morality in the Philosophy of Right, Quante's book makes a strong case for reinstating Hegel as a relevant figure for contemporary philosophy of action. Part of his success here flows from his way of framing the issues involved as well as from his judicious selection of Hegel's texts. By centering his account on a careful interpretation of a few dozen paragraphs from this presentation of Hegel's philosophy of "objective spirit", and by relating them to systematic principles from works like the Science of Logic, Quante has revealed just how rich, from a contemporary point of view, Hegel's philosophical analysis of action actually is. But he has achieved this by being prepared to delve beneath the surface of Hegel's form of expression. Neither slavishly retracing Hegel's own presentation, nor simply trying to render Hegel in the idiom of contemporary analytic philosophy, Quante stakes out a middle ground by developing some key concepts of his own which allow him to mediate Hegel's idiosyncratic presentation with more familiar approaches. While he in no way tries to justify Hegel's underlying logic, let alone the metaphysics he regards as accompanying it, by utilizing the resources of contemporary philosophical analyses of action and intention in his reconstructions of Hegel's own presentation, he has succeeded in bringing real illumination to Hegel's philosophy.

The starting point of Hegel's theory--the claim that actions should be regarded as "expressions of the subjective will"--may not at first sight look promising from any contemporary analytic perspective. But rather than taking this to be some metaphysically laden starting point from which Hegel tries to build a substantive ontological theory of action, Quante presents it as a claim made from within a perspective fundamentally concerned with the ways in which we attribute actions to each other and ourselves when we "do things with words" such as criticize, defend, excuse, and explain them--that is, it is presented from the perspective of our "praxes of attribution and evaluation". The exact place of this theory of intentional action within Hegel's overall system is thus crucial for understanding the nature of its claims. Specifically, his account of action has to be understood as functioning within his account of morality, which in turn must be understood in relation to his theory of legality. Just as how within some particular legal process questions of whether this or that person can be judged as responsible for this or that wrong-doing are kept separate from global metaphysical concerns about the place for responsibility in a deterministic world, here Hegel unpacks the logic of evaluation within a practice already largely in place. Given his systematicity, of course, Hegel will have to address somewhere questions such as how to think of the nature of free subjective willing in relation to our organically based desires and needs, and he does so in his philosophy of "subjective spirit", which in the system precedes that of "objective spirit". But Quante is happy to allude to the general direction of those aspects of Hegel's thought in order to maintain a focus here on the more "internalist" question of Hegel's conception of the structure of evaluation.

It is this enframing of these philosophical questions within intersubjective practices of attribution that brings Hegel's approach into relation to those of Anscombe, Davidson and others, who have focussed on the significance of the description under which any action is attributed. While any action will be able to be described in a variety of ways, we only attribute to an agent as intentional an action described in ways such that the agent herself would recognize it as her doing. It was effectively this idea that Hegel had been proposing with his idea of an agent's "right to knowledge". It is only when considered under such descriptions that actions will be thought as able to "express the agent's subjective will". From Hegel's approach, the very understanding of what it is to be an agent with a "subjective will" will not be an issue that can be understood in abstraction from that agent's role in language games in which we talk of ourselves and others in particular ways.

Quante shows how Hegel distinguishes between a level at which acts will be described as mere events able to be considered in terms of their causal relations, a level at which they can be considered as freely undertaken "deeds" attributed to a "doer", and finally the level at which they can be considered as "actions" expressive of an agent's subjective will. In regard to the distinction between "deed" and "action", Hegel had effectively followed and modified Kant's account by distinguishing between the focus of legal forms of attribution and assessment, in which the concern is primarily with the "external" deed itself, and the moral focus on the subjective intention expressed in that deed now considered as an action. Thus Hegel had started at the same point as Kant, approaching the realm of legality as one in which acts are regarded in relation to external necessitation and constraint, in contrast to which morality was to be regarded as a realm in which this necessitation was thought of as internal. In Hegel's idiosyncratic terminology, legality concerns the expressions of a subjective will whose freedom is "in itself" while in morality the freely acting will is now regarded as existing "for itself". But Hegel was critical of Kant's way of regarding the relation of morality to legality--critical both of his way of conceiving of the logic of moral evaluation in relation to that of legal evaluation and of his somewhat "Cartesian" understanding of the sense in which the "internality" of intention contrasts with the "externality" of action.

Quante develops Hegel's approach by introducing the idea of different forms of "self-relation" presupposed by the realms of legally considered deeds and morally considered actions respectively. To relate to oneself as a "person", whose deeds are expressive of one's own subjective will and subject only to legal evaluation, is to grasp oneself in terms of a self-relation that is formally universalizable, that is, as an "I" subject to external prescriptive laws applying equally to all legal subjects. Moreover, this self-relation, which Hegel characterizes by the formula "I=I", also captures the sense in which "persons" are free in their acts in as much as those acts express a free choice subject only to external legal constraint. Kant had conceived morality as a type of internalized legality in the sense that in moral action the constraining requirement of universalizability was self-imposed by the rational self-legislating agent whose moral action thereby expressed a "higher" grade of freedom than merely that of freedom of choice. (Hegel's term for the moral analogue of "person" was "subject", and Quante helpfully distinguishes the confusing variety of senses in which Hegel uses this latter term.) Hegel's criticism of the "formalism" of Kant's conception of morality is well-known and has been widely discussed in moral and political philosophy, but exactly where Hegel is coming from in his criticism of Kant, and so where he is headed, and just how much of the Kantian framework is integrated into Hegel's own account via his peculiar move of the "Aufhebung" which both negates and yet preserves the criticized approach, is in general less well understood. One of the bonuses of Quante's book is the clarity and insight that it brings to the actual nature of Hegel's relation to Kant on these issues.

The primacy given to the practice of attribution means that Hegel's perspective is a cognitivist one--action is to be considered as mediated by beliefs about or interpretations of the agent's situation, needs, etc. Thus while the contents of volition will ultimately stem from some matter of the "natural will", the "subjective will" that is here under consideration will already be downstream of what Henry Allison has referred to as Kant's "incorporation thesis": the subjective content that is ascribed to an agent will be something which itself has the conceptual or propositional form necessary for it to enter into the types of inferential relations that structure the space of rational evaluations within which the content stands. Thus Quante's Hegel seems to be heading towards a position akin to the Sellarsian "inferentialist" account of semantic content developed by Robert Brandom.

Quante's second chapter, "Intentionality: The Form of Subjective Freedom", and the fourth, "The Form of Action", together make up the substantive core of the book. Particularly impressive in the account of intentionality is Quante's painstaking reconstruction of a single key sentence from ยค 110 of the Philosophy of Right bearing on the way that the form of a propositionally expressed intentional content can be regarded as expressing the individual subjectivity of the agent. The problem is to understand how the "universality" of the content that is presupposed in an approach starting from the practices of intersubjective attribution can nevertheless express a singular subjective will. After noting the double appearance of the phrase "for me" in Hegel's sentence, Quante then proceeds to analyse the sentence by first eliminating these tokens and then reintroducing them to observe the differences each make. (At the same time he generalizes these forms by rendering them in the third person ("for X") and rephrases the passage in the indicative rather than Hegel's subjunctive mood.) Quante argues that the meaning of Hegel's first "for X" can be captured by the type of analyses found in Perry's account of indexicality or, alternatively, in the "direct attribution" accounts of self-ascription found in Lewis and Chisholm. The second "for X" has a different meaning, however, bearing on the nature of the attitude within which the propositional content is held. Specifically, it is the content of an imperative to act in accordance with that content.

While the focus of the first three chapters was on Hegel's notion of the subjective will, in the final two it shifts to the action itself, chapter 4 looking at its form, chapter 5 at its content. In chapter 4, which is the more substantive of the two, Quante attempts to separate two different distinctions presupposed by Hegel's use of the Anscombean idea of action under a description--that between "action" and "deed" qua different types of description, and that between such descriptions and the events described--and reconstructs Hegel's hierarchy of intentional contents, which Hegel attempts to capture with the notions of "purpose" [Vorsatz] and "intention" [Absicht]. While there is much that is rich and suggestive in this chapter, my feeling is that here the difficulties facing such attempts to mediate Hegel's account with modern "action-theoretic" approaches become most apparent. Quante appeals to Alvin Goldman's use of the idea of "basic action" to capture the narrower idea of intention implicit in Hegel's idea of "purpose". Basic actions are those actions with which one performs other more complexly intentional actions: one votes in a meeting by raising one's arm, for example, but one doesn't in turn raise one's arm by performing some other more basic action. In contrast, the richer content of Hegel's "intention" is one that can only be understood in terms of the place that such a content occupies within some inferentially articulated process of reasoning. Systematic applications of action-theoretical approaches like that of Goldman's tend to presuppose fundamentally naturalistic ontologies that are, of course, foreign to Hegel, and so one might question the degree to which they can be separated from this in order to capture Hegel's thought. Alongside this, one might wonder about the possibility of moving easily between conceptions of "content" articulated by the resources of post-Fregean logic on the one hand and Hegel's own idiosyncratic reworking of Aristotelian syllogistic logic and Kantian "transcendental logic" on the other. And yet, when Quante's is joined to Brandom's work, one might also now start to feel optimistic about possible solutions to such difficulties.

That questions of this type are able to come into focus is itself part of the achievement of Hegel's Concept of Action as, for those who wish to join him in his project, Quante effectively shows exactly where further work has to be done. In general, for readers interested in Hegel's practical philosophy, as well as those more generally interested in learning about Hegel the philosopher rather than the myth, the sophistication and clarity with which it unpacks some of Hegel's most difficult thoughts makes this book invaluable.