Hegel's Conscience

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Dean Moyar, Hegel's Conscience, Oxford University Press, 2011, 220pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195391992.

Reviewed by Peter Thielke, Pomona College


Despite a growing interest in Hegel among Anglophone philosophers, there has been relatively little attention paid to the specific structure of Hegel's ethical views. Given this situation, it is gratifying to report not only that Dean Moyar's Hegel's Conscience seeks to fill this gap, but also that it does so in such an interesting and rewarding way. Far from being the paragon of impenetrability, Moyar's Hegel develops a theory of agency and ethical action that is both clear and cogent, as well as highly relevant to contemporary debates about these issues. The book is excellent and should be of interest not only to scholars of German Idealism but also to anyone seeking new options in currently ossified metaethical debates. It is not an exhaustive account of all aspects of Hegel's ethics, but it promises to lay the groundwork for what might well become a serious Hegelian alternative to more familiar models of moral agency.

The kernel of Moyar's argument concerns the central role of conscience in Hegel's ethics. At first glance, this might look like a rather unpromising place to start, since even Hegel himself castigates the ethics of conscience: if the moral worth of my actions is entirely dependent on whether I in good conscience perform them, then it seems that anything would be permitted, so long as I act with full conviction. As Moyar argues, however, such claims have misled commentators into thinking that Hegel is suspicious of all forms of conscience, when in fact his complaint is only with an ethics based on formal or abstract conscience alone. Rather, as Moyar claims, actual conscience for Hegel is the locus of practical reason; it "stands for a complex set of capacities that include judgment, inference, deliberation, belief, etc." (14). The agent of conscience acts on the subjective belief that her actions are right, but this is buttressed by the idea that objective reasons can be provided to support these beliefs. And, in one of the most interesting claims of the book, Moyar shows that, for Hegel, these reasons of conscience can only be understood in the context of a robust social practice -- Hegel's ethics is, in the end, based on a holistic account of inner and outer reasons that together form the complex web of individual agency within a larger society.

The book is organized into six chapters, beginning with an account of self-consciousness and agency, moving through a discussion of motivating and justifying reason, ethical holism, deliberation and justification, and mutual recognition, before culminating in an interpretation of what Hegel means by Ethical Life. Moyar draws primarily from the Phenomenology of Spirit and the Philosophy of Right and is a careful and charitable reader; he is especially good at explicating Hegel's notoriously obscure texts and showing the consistent argument that runs through Hegel's discussions of ethical agency. He also does an excellent job of relating Hegel's views to contemporary positions, notably those of Richard Moran, Bernard Williams, Jonathan Dancy and Barbara Herman. This aspect of the book is most welcome, since it provides a clear path to the issues at the heart of Hegel's position while making them accessible to readers who might not be wholly at home in the Phenomenology or the Philosophy of Right.

Moyar's interpretation of Hegel is cast in terms of an ethical holism in which "an agent's motivating reasons stem from purposes that can be nested within broader purposes that provide the justifying reasons for the action" (74) -- what Moyar calls the 'Complex Reasons Identity Condition' (CRIC). The central idea -- one that is both novel and provocative -- is that an agent can behave ethically without needing always to act on the deliberate motive of duty, or even for the perceived general good. This might seem paradoxical, since the hallmark of ethical behavior is usually taken to depend on the subjective reasons or maxims that guide an action, and it is tempting to think that actions not directed by such an internal 'ought' would fail to live up to our ethical requirements. But as Moyar persuasively argues, Hegel rejects this view and has good reasons to do so. If morality rests on a set of absolute duties, or an abstract system of imperatives, Hegel claims, we can give no explanation of what would motivate an agent to act in such a way, unless she were already in possession of a particular internal motive to do so. Rather, by invoking Williams' notion of a standing purpose that reflects an agent's own interests, Moyar holds that for an ethical world to be rational, "it must be a system of objective purposes that are structured such that standing purposes of individuals can be nested within them" (76). This is essentially what Moyar takes Hegelian conscience to involve.

Such a view might threaten to devolve into a pernicious form of egoism, in which ethical duties are swallowed by self-interest, but Hegel's distinctive solution to this problem is one of the most interesting aspects of Moyar's project. What halts the slide into egoism is the nesting relationship between motives and justifications. Objective duties are not just side constraints on what bare egoism can pursue, but rather our self-interested reasons are at the same time justified by objective ethical structures manifested in social institutions: in Civil Society, "pursuing one's interest is one's duty" (70). This involves both a subjective and an objective element of agency. The latter is explicated by appeal to the notion of the transparency of self-consciousness in action, which Moyar draws from Moran: our motives are not simply brute psychological facts, but rather are reflections of those things for which we find good reasons. We act on beliefs about what we take to be our good because we rationally endorse them. These reasons, however, are not purely subjective, but are also informed by the objective moral facts and principles that govern social institutions, to which each particular motive must be answerable. In acting on my self-interest, I legitimately am also doing my duty, but only so long as my actions can also be justified in light of prevailing moral principles. According to CRIC, motives and justifications stand in a nested relationship, and actual conscience is just this complex activity of practical reason in acting according to CRIC.

This is a subtle position, and perhaps an example drawn from Moyar will help make it clearer. In helping my daughter with her homework, say, my motives are directed at her individual needs, and arise from my concern about her well-being; in this subjective sense, I am acting only on my and her interests. But my interest is also guided and justified by larger social -- and objective -- considerations: parents have a duty to their children, and there are certain legal and social obligations that have institutionalized these moral demands. These need not be my proximate motives in helping her, but they are part of my complex set of reasons for action, and my action only makes sense, according to Hegel, when this set is treated as a holistic unity. For Hegel, objective justifications do not impose alien external constraints on my actions, but are rather included in the complex internal motives that direct my behavior. The holism here is crucial: I would not be an ethical agent were my motivations solely self-interested, with no recognition of the objective demands that society places on me; but neither would I be a complete agent were I always to require that my motives be general moral duties abstracted from my particular interests. Were I to help my daughter only because I was motivated by a duty towards human welfare in general, I would be guilty, as Moyar puts it, borrowing a phrase from Williams, of 'one thought too many.'

Moral failure occurs when this holism is broken apart; taking a point from Dancy, Moyar argues that for Hegel we err when we detach one element from the complex whole and treat this as the only morally relevant feature of a situation. This detachment can take either a subjective or an objective form. In the former, I privilege abstract moral duties at the expense of particular interests or circumstances, in which case I open myself to the charge of hollow formalism, since I cannot specify how I should act in an actual situation without undermining the presumed priority of the abstract moral law. In the latter, I take my particular motives and interests as the only salient features of a moral situation and ignore the objective social element that provides external justification for my actions. In either case, the conditions on actual conscience that describe ethical agency are not met.

This account of moral holism and conscience occupies roughly the first half of Hegel's Conscience; the latter part is largely devoted to spelling out what the content of morality involves. Moral demands arise within social contexts and reflect the various institutional and cultural expectations that guide our actions. By appealing to Herman's distinction between judgment and deliberation, Moyar argues that Hegel too sees moral agency not in terms of constantly testing maxims of action but rather in a settled disposition to act according to the various social roles one adopts. These roles in turn provide the contents of our moral activity, which are captured in "rules of moral salience" (115). In acting as a father, for instance, I do not constantly need to be deliberating about the moral basis for what I am doing; I simply act in the way proper for parents. Of course, my behavior can be challenged, in which case I am called upon to give a reason for my actions or to deliberate about what I ought to do. Given CRIC, however, these reasons and deliberations are not external to my moral concerns, but rather are part of the more complex account of agency that explains my actions. On Moyar's reading, Hegel's notorious account of freedom as simply living under the right social system is recast in a far more plausible light, which reveals that actual freedom is found in the alignment of universal conditions and particular internal motives. For the agent of conscience, there is no gap between the freely endorsed intention and the 'accomplished action'; because such an agent "takes all circumstances into account in deliberation, he foresees both the consequences of the action and how others will relate to it" (155).

This holistic account of agency also has some interesting implications for the types of institutional structures that provide the objective or external content to moral conscience. Here, Moyar argues, the key for Hegel is mutual recognition, either in directly engaging with another agent, which "is the norm in case of challenges to an agent's action," or more indirectly, in respecting others' purposes within the larger social context (145). And, in an especially well done discussion, Moyar shows how various aspects of the state, such as marriage, legal procedures, and institutions designed to ensure overall welfare, dialectically emerge from this account of conscience.

Such a brief summary unfortunately leaves out many important details of Moyar's rich and rewarding work. There are also some questions that remain about the force of Hegel's position, especially concerning the status of CRIC. Is CRIC intended to be a description of what our reasons actually involve, or rather a normative standard that we might often fail to meet? Either of these alternatives might look problematic: if CRIC is descriptive, then Hegel seems hard-pressed to account for cases in which our various motives and reasons cannot be reconciled, such as when I violate the speed limit to save time, or do too much of my daughter's homework for her. Here I have reasons that I take to be compelling, but it's not clear that my rational justification is also one that will "aim at universality" (147). If cases like this are fairly frequent (and it seems like they are), then the conditions of ethical agency that CRIC lays out are not often satisfied, and the ground of Hegel's concrete Ethical Life could be called into question. This suggests that CRIC should instead be treated normatively, as a goal for ethical agency, but such a view might run afoul of Hegel's intention of finding "a 'totality' in which the ought is overcome" (140). Indeed, unless I have antecedent dispositions to try to meet the conditions of CRIC, it seems that Hegel's own criticisms of Kant and other 'moralists' would apply equally well to the normative reading of the principle. In any case, given its crucial role in Moyar's argument, the status of CRIC could be made clearer.

More broadly, Moyar sees Hegel as attempting to complete the Kantian system (11), but the emphasis on CRIC might instead be seen as moving Hegel further away from Kant. For Kant, creatures like us will always confront a tension in our practical agency, between the demands of the moral law and our inclination toward self-interest. Despite the wonder that the 'moral law within' inspires in Kant, he nonetheless holds that we are always tempted to let our particular advantage supersede the moral law. So long as our motive is our duty, then Kant would likely agree with CRIC, but his worries are that our motives frequently are not drawn from duty; this is what predisposes us to immorality. Hegel, however, seems -- at least on Moyar's account -- to have a far more optimistic view of humanity than does Kant; for Hegel, the possibility of reconciling our particular interest and our moral duty is a hallmark of Ethical Life, and he is critical of Kant for seeing morality and self-interest as often opposed to each other. But if Hegel's solution in fact rests on a reconception of human nature, it's not clear that he is solving Kant's problems, instead of just offering a competing vision of the human condition.

Finally, one of the great strengths of Hegel's Conscience is Moyar's ability to demystify Hegel's jargon and to connect his concerns to contemporary views in ethics. But this strategy also raises some questions about the force of Moyar's interpretation. These concerns are not directed at the general method of juxtaposing historical and contemporary issues -- in the Introduction, Moyar does an excellent job of defending the value of such an approach -- but rather with the specific details of how Hegel's overall view can be squared with the various contemporary accounts Moyar introduces. Moyar draws from parts of a number of contemporary views, but says little about whether they all -- Dancy's particularism, Williams' critique of the 'morality system,' Herman's Kantianism, and so on -- can be held together in a consistent system. The worry is that Moyar cherry picks features of positions whose foundations stand opposed to Hegel's broader views. Despite a shared holistic view of the ethical enterprise, for instance, it's not clear that Dancy's and Williams' broader accounts can be squared with Hegel's more rationalistic and systematic general position.

This is less a criticism than a call for further elaboration, for if indeed Hegel's ethical position were capable of reconciling all of these various positions, or -- perhaps better -- of combining attractive elements of each into a consistent whole, this would make the already strong position Moyar develops on Hegel's behalf even more interesting as a new contender in metaethical debates. As it stands, Hegel's Conscience provides both an admirably clear and accessible interpretation of Hegel's texts and a novel and provocative account of agency, one that will, in concert with other work emerging from the renewed interest in Hegel, likely form the basis for a distinctively Hegelian metaethical position.