Hegel's Naturalism: Mind, Nature, and the Final Ends of Life

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Terry Pinkard, Hegel's Naturalism: Mind, Nature, and the Final Ends of Life, Oxford University Press, 2012, 213pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199860791.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


In just 200 pages of text plus notes, Terry Pinkard's new book is a masterpiece of clear, scrupulous exposition and an exceptionally able defense of Hegel's thought. It is, if anything, more interesting philosophically than the outstandingly accomplished Hegel exegesis that it also is. In taking up the broad theme of culture as second nature, both metaphysically and ethico-politically, Pinkard combines the virtues of McDowell on second nature (but with more historical details and a more developed conception of history than anything on offer in McDowell), Merleau-Ponty on embodiment (but with a greater sense of the role, too, of reason in concept formation and revision, especially in ethics, than in Merleau-Ponty), and Brandom on inferential articulation (but with a greater sense of human embodiment and of the situation of the human subject in the modern world than in Brandom).

The exegesis and defense come in two parts. Chapters 1 and 2 focus on Hegel's neo-Aristotelian conception of nature and hence are devoted to the metaphysics of human beings as self-interpreting animals (in Charles Taylor's phrase) in relation to physical nature. Chapters 3 to 7 focus on how human beings à la Hegel have developed and expressed their self-consciousness as norm articulators by developing, living according to, and revising conceptions of the good. These latter chapters arrive at the conclusion that "self-reflection on the part of natural creatures is the final end of the world, at least in the sense that there is no further purpose outside of that purpose itself and that such a purpose is, or can become, intelligible to itself" (p. 191). While acknowledging "the always potential gap between . . . fact and norm in one's own case and the contingency of the specific shape of the shape one's life has taken" (p. 180), it is nonetheless possible, Pinkard argues, for human beings to arrive at a good enough "reconciliation of a sort" with themselves and with others (p. 180), via continually re-achieving and practically re-enacting a kind of situated self-comprehension.

The metaphysics of what Pinkard calls "disenchanted Aristotelian naturalism," developed in Chapters 1 and 2, is the strongest part of the book. Nature 'on its own,' as it were, is disenchanted. It "aims at nothing" (p. 23), and it is best studied on its own by doing the hard work of law-formulation and testing in the experimental-mathematical natural sciences. Yet "'we' as natural creatures make ourselves distinct from nature" (p. 20) by developing norms that we, unlike other animals, use consciously and explicitly to regulate our beliefs and actions. Built by us 'on top of' sensory awareness and non-explicit goal pursuing (as in, e.g., eating and reproducing), believing, inferring, deliberating, deciding and so on all become explicit for us, so that we have a kind of inwardness in consciously holding ourselves to norms and revising them that other animals lack (pp. 28-9). This self-consciousness is not originally of the subject/object form, as though the self were just one among many given objects in the world. Instead it arises in and through the emergent apperceptive awareness that my perspective on an object or my way of taking it under a concept to be a kind of thing is not the only possible perspective on it (pp. 45-47). The questions that then naturally arise for us, as we attempt to cope with the objects of our world (including other agents) fruitfully, under awareness of the partiality of one's own perspective, are: How is it in fact correct to 'take' things, and what is it in fact good to do? Unlike other animals, we do not live in "restricted satisfactions" only, and we need an articulated conception of the good in order to rank order our multiple desires and other forms of project-having. Hence Aristotle's question -- what is the complete (intrinsic and non-dependent) and self-sufficient (able to be willed continuously) good for us? -- is essentially on our agenda for reflection and for testing through action.

With this metaphysics of the human being as self-interpreting animal in place, Pinkard then develops an answer to this Aristotelian question in the latter four chapters of the book. Invoking the Hegelian conception of freedom as being "bei sich selbst in einem anderen," the answer is that "the final end of life" -- the good that can be continuously willed for its own sake -- is "being at one with oneself in activity" (p. 104). Achieving this requires working through both one's desires, projects, and conceptions, on the one hand, and the conditions under which they are enacted and tested on the other.

The actually free agent seeks to change the conditions surrounding her action so that what she finds she must do within the given conditions of her activity (both those of her own second nature and the social and natural conditions surrounding her) is something about which she can make some rational sense (p. 100).

But how is one to do that? While it is, Pinkard argues, "a dangerous fantasy" (p. 102) to suppose that one can arrive at free and meaningful life fully and absolutely, the question of what such a life might look like -- personally and socially -- is one that can be and has been fruitfully addressed historically. Both ethical and political thought must be concrete, in engaging critically with emergent real possibilities of more free and meaningful life, and they must be different from each other. Ethical thinking must address the problem of balancing self-consciousness and all but ironic awareness of personal idiosyncrasy, on the one hand, against absorption in activity, on the other. Political thought must address the problem of balancing the claims of individuality and the importance of rights, on the one hand, against the need in modern complex societies for an administrative bureaucracy of experts. Neither an abstract moral theory of principles alone nor a moralized politics will meet such needs.

But there is also good reason to think that they can be met, or at least that good enough balances can be achieved. Individuals might achieve "an ironic intimacy within [their] absorption in [their] daily activities" (p. 179) or a good enough sense of orientation that is quite different from any corrosive Schleglian ironism, a Peter Pan-ish refusal to grow up, or a pervasive sense of the absurd as in Jean Paul. A modern society can achieve a good enough balance of individual liberty and chances for meaningful life and work with stability, order, and social wholeness, especially if the need for ongoing concrete ethical and political thinking is taken seriously. Endorsing Hegel, Pinkard's mostly optimistic thought is that a kind of phronesis and concrete pursuit of the mean (p. 181), together with critical philosophical thought as what Hegel calls "the eternal movement to sublate this immediacy" (p. 188) in light of emerging technical, ethical, social, and political possibilities, might enable us continuously to actualize our final end of understanding ourselves concretely as self-interpreting animals and so afford us the satisfactions that are characteristic of a self-conscious, active, embodied being.

All this makes for an immense sweep of compressed argument. As a result there is sure to be resistance from various camps not already sympathetic with the metaphysics or ethics of either Hegel or Aristotle. Strong, post-Quinean physicalist naturalists will be unhappy with the formulation that "the human agent . . . actualizes something that is already in play in animal life but that, as put to work in that way, becomes fundamentally different from it" (p. 48), and they will be equally unhappy with the thought that agents have as a result, per se, a non-optional final end of understanding themselves in and through their activity. To some ears, this will sound like a form of exceptionalism about the human in relation to the rest of nature, and they will demand an account of the exact mechanisms or physical processes through which the work of the 'actualization' of capacities is done. Yet, for well known reasons having to do with normativity, the necessity of charity in psychological ascription, and so on, it is hard to see how some form of exceptionalism could be descriptively false, at least prima facie. Still, a somewhat more extended psychology of individual development, in addition to talk of agentive powers on the part of human beings in general, could help to bolster Pinkard's metaphysics of agency.

Exegetically, Pinkard's Hegel is a less doctrinaire, less religious, more modest and critical thinker than is to be found in more traditional accounts, and Pinkard is a master of finding and unpacking passages that support his reading. Yet the passages that he cites are not consistently unambiguous. For example, the remark from §31 of the Encyclopedia Logic that Pinkard cites does not describe us in general, we moderns, as "freely disembarking into the wide-open, with nothing below us and nothing above us" but only a "feeling [that] . . . is characteristic of free thought."[1] Similarly, the passage from the Lectures on Aesthetics that Pinkard cites (p. 176) about human beings as "amphibious animals" who live within a range of oppositions between duty and sensuous impulse, abstract law and particularity, and so on does not cast life within these oppositions as permanent, but instead goes on to add "that truth lies only in the reconciliation and mediation of both, and that this mere mediation is no mere demand, but what is absolutely accomplished and is ever self-accomplishing."[2] While it can be read more as describing ongoing processes than as describing stably accomplished results -- and while it is true that there are other passages from the late 1820s, especially in the Aesthetics where Hegel displays some reserve about the achievements of modern life -- this passage also expresses a degree of optimism about reconciliation that exceeds Pinkard's more modest claims, however attractive philosophically Pinkard's modesty also is.

Pinkard is perhaps a bit quick to move from the claim that confession and forgiveness are available modes of action that enable reconciliation to the further claim that in fact "each comes to see himself in the other" (p. 142). In Hegel, this move is ultimately underwritten by an already in place shared understanding, expressed in modern religious practices, on the part of the opposed agents that they are each in some sense created beings, so that they share a fundamental likeness to one another. Pinkard can appeal to his metaphysics of agency likewise to underwrite a fundamental likeness among agents, but will this likeness count enough for agents, within their awareness, to motivate them to take up possibilities of reconciliation in the face of significant concrete oppositions? The oppositional character of contemporary joint social life suggests that the answer is, often enough, "no."

If, moreover, oppositions are not so readily overcome, as Pinkard concedes in noting also our continuing fragmentariness, then conceptions of the human that emphasize a more standing indigence and a need for more compensatory-anticipatory, perhaps aesthetic-artistic, satisfactions à la Adorno become more significant for the course of life than Pinkard perhaps wishes to admit. In addition, if that is true, then there may also be a greater need for a politics of principle, developed from a distantiated, general point of view involving commitment to fairness, in addition to a politics of concrete political thinking in order resolutely to preserve space for individual particularities to develop within a system of rights.

Finally, Pinkard's thought that we might achieve "ironic intimacy" in our personal lives by, as Hegel puts it, fulfilling "every task, no matter how trivial, with heart and soul" (p. 174) is both a mature thought -- what more fruitfully might one do than this? -- yet also one that smacks a bit of a somewhat detached, almost hobbyist, stance of cultivez votre jardin (while of course remembering, too, that concrete self-understanding is the final end of human life). No doubt we should resist overweening temptations to political wholeness, but are all addresses to political wholeness substantially overweening?

None of these hesitations should, however, deter anyone from appreciating the astonishing achievement of this book. In developing all at once the metaphysics, ethics, and politics of Hegel's version of a disenchanted Aristotelian naturalism attractively, clearly, argumentatively and in continuous engagement with major problems of modern life and thought, Hegel's Naturalism is as stunningly good a piece of systematic philosophy in relation to modern life as one is likely to find anywhere.

[1] G. W. F. Hegel, The Logic of Hegel, trans. William Wallace, (Oxford: Clarendon 1974), Zusatz to §31, p. 55.

[2] Hegel, Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art, Vol. 1, trans. T. M. Knox (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975, p. 55).