Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit: A Critical Guide

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Dean Moyar and Michael Quante (eds.), Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 258pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521874540.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Church, Duke University


Few texts in the history of thought are as difficult and yet as exciting as Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. In the 201 years since its publication, the Phenomenology has had a broad influence on diverse fields of thought, including philosophy, sociology, theology, political science, and literary theory. It has been a source of philosophical inspiration for some and the frustratingly wrong-headed celebration of everything disastrous in modern thought for others. Yet what remains constant is that the Phenomenology demands and indeed has elicited thoughtful interlocutors who must combine Hegel's own qualities -- at once philosophically rigorous and focused, and also imaginative and comprehensive. The twelve contributors to Moyar and Quante's excellent volume are readers of just this variety. They wrestle with small portions of Hegel's challenging text and show how Hegel's insights can help advance and even transform our thinking about traditional philosophical problems. This makes the Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit: A Critical Guide a belated but fitting bicentennial birthday present.

This volume is the first to appear in Cambridge's "Critical Guide" series, which is devoted to examining the great works of philosophy, one work at a time (future installments will include Mill's On Liberty (December 2008) and Kant's "Idea for a Universal History" (May 2009)). One outstanding feature of this series is that it collects an "international team of contributors," and Moyar and Quante's volume is certainly no exception. German scholars like Fulda, Horstmann, and Siep have been producing excellent work on Hegel for more than a generation, but have not enjoyed a wide English-language readership. In the past ten years, however, more and more translations of German scholarly works on Hegel have appeared (see, for instance, Quante's Hegel's Concept of Action (2004) and Pippin and Höffe (eds.), Hegel on Ethics and Politics (2004)). This volume continues this salutary trend by including essays by six leading German philosophers.

The aim of the volume is twofold: first, the essays try to clarify Hegel's arguments and purposes in some of the central or especially difficult passages of the Phenomenology. The volume is organized in accordance with Hegel's own text, though some portions of the Phenomenology are given much more attention than others: four essays are devoted to the chapter on Spirit, for instance, whereas only one examines the chapter on Reason.

The second aim of the volume explains in part this disproportional treatment. Each essay elicits those arguments in Hegel, which, when suitably clarified, can be brought to bear on contemporary philosophical problems. As Moyar and Quante argue in the Preface, these claims include Hegel's epistemological "holism", his account of the relationship between the "natural and the normative," and his view of the relationship between theory and practice (xiii-xiv). These different claims are rooted in Hegel's difficult concept of "Spirit," which commentators have increasingly come to understand in a non-metaphysical sense. That is, commentators, and especially those in this volume (with Horstmann an important exception), have come to explain this concept in terms of something like Sellars' "space of reasons," or of what Pinkard calls in his recent book on the Phenomenology "social space," that is, as a self-developing system of norms embedded in concrete social and political institutions from which individuals derive their self-understanding. In recent years, this concept of Spirit has gained some traction in Anglo-American analytic philosophy in the work of Robert Brandom and John McDowell. Most of the contributors in this volume recognize Brandom's inferentialism in one way or another as a promising programmatic statement of some central Hegelian claims (see Heidemann, Moyar, and Pippin), yet see greater possibilities in Hegel's concept of Spirit than Brandom's pragmatism admits.

The twelve contributors to this volume all admirably accomplish these two aims. In what follows, however, I do not have space to review all the fine essays in this volume, but can only provide a sample of the contents. The first three essays try to explain what Hegel's project in the Phenomenology is and how he justifies it. The three authors -- Heidemann, Fulda, and Horstmann -- agree on the basic outline of Hegel's project. Hegel's project establishes what Horstmann calls a "new paradigm in epistemology" (49) by responding to the problem of skepticism besetting previous theories. For Hegel, skepticism has revealed the inadequacy of foundationalism, the attempt to find a self-evident or self-grounding principle that bridges the apparently impassable gulf between subject and object. Hegel's response to this problem is to reject the foundationalist project and adopt what Heidemann calls Hegel's "methodological anti-individualism" -- his "holism." What brings together subject and object, for Hegel, is a self-reflecting system of normative thought that transcends each individual or particular consciousness (8).

Though these three authors broadly agree as to what Hegel's phenomenological project is, they offer different perspectives on how Hegel justifies this project. Heidemann emphasizes the historical development of these "shapes of consciousness", and how each shape creates foundational norms that govern the relationship between subject and object. Hegel justifies the final position in the history of self-consciousness, "Absolute Knowledge," by showing how history necessarily leads to Absolute Knowledge, and Absolute Knowledge supplies an epistemic system that is not internally contradictory. However, Heidemann argues, Hegel's method of justification is circular -- for "the standpoint of philosophical truth is a constitutive element needed to make sense of" the history of self-consciousness, yet this history is supposed to itself justify the final standpoint (18). While Heidemann argues that Hegel cannot escape from this problem of circularity, Fulda and Horstmann argue that Hegel's position can be salvaged. For Fulda, the Phenomenology is best seen as a "work in progress" (28), rather than as a completed edifice of knowledge. As such, though later moments in the history of self-consciousness may solve or answer problems plaguing previous moments, no moment provides an absolutely self-justified endpoint at which point Spirit can finally come to rest. Horstmann takes a different tack in offering a highly interesting and original account of what he calls Hegel's "transcendentalistic" form of argument. Hegel's form of argument is an advance over Kant's "transcendental" argument, which dogmatically takes a particular configuration of subject and object for granted (in what Kant calls "experience"). For Hegel, the very notions of subject and object and their relationship are open to question. His "negative transcendental argument" discerns what the conditions for the possibility of cognition as such are -- and after running through a series of failed attempts to render cognition possible, Hegel shows that only his own position makes sense of cognition (52).

The next three essays by DeVries, Honneth, and Quante discuss important parts of Hegel's chapters "Consciousness," "Self-Consciousness," and "Reason," respectively. DeVries carefully examines Hegel's arguments in "Sense Certainty," which attempt to show that there can be no immediate cognitive contact with the world. Rather, the relationship between subject and object is necessarily mediated by concepts. DeVries insightfully brings out that the problem with "Sense Certainty" is not primarily that we cannot express the plenum of sense-data (as other interpreters have claimed), but that the very process of picking out something as "this" requires that we employ concepts, that we are operating within a "background of demonstrative practices that determine a complex space of possible demonstrations" (73). For DeVries, Hegel's arguments can provide a helpful supplement to Wilfrid Sellars' still all-too-Kantian notion of intuition.

Axel Honneth is an eminent figure in political philosophy in his own right, in part because of his influential social-psychological reading of Hegel's view of recognition. Honneth's essay is on the transition from "Desire" to "Recognition" and is of great value not just for those of us interested in Honneth's work on recognition. Honneth delves deeply into and illuminates some of the most difficult portions of Hegel's entire work (paragraphs 166-177), while helping to combat the "anthropological" understanding of Hegel's view of recognition made popular by Alexander Kojève (87n7). Honneth interprets Hegel's argument as proceeding in three steps. First, the "Consciousness" chapter concludes with the claim that the "I" constitutes all of reality. Yet, second, this pure "I" reveals little or nothing about its own nature -- thus, self-consciousness must come to see that it is not a "placeless, selective consciousness, but that it instead relates to organic reality" (80). By consuming natural goods and satisfying its basic organic desires, self-consciousness can come to understand itself as a being that can master nature through its consuming activity. Third, however, this "organic" self-consciousness actually reveals itself to be dependent on nature in uninhibitedly following its desires. Self-consciousness can only gain genuine knowledge of itself as a free and independent being when it restricts its desires in the face of another self-consciousness. The activity of self-restriction is genuinely free because it is rooted in the respect for another's desires (88). Honneth's account is scrupulously based in the text, yet it is surprising that he makes no mention of the concept of "Spirit" towards which the discussion is pointed in paragraph 177 and how spirit is related to the concept of recognition. Nor does he show how this transition to recognition is related to the famous "Master-Slave Dialectic," following precisely on the paragraphs he examines.

The next four essays by Pinkard, Dudley, Moyar, and Siep take on Hegel's difficult concept of Spirit. Pinkard's essay is invaluable for its clarity and insight in shedding light on what the concept of spirit is and how it develops in time. Pinkard explains that for Hegel "Spirit" consists not just of a system of norms delineating proper theoretical and practical judgments, but also of a collective understanding about "what it is about the world that makes these norms realizable" (114). "Spirit," then, is not the result of conscious agreement within a community, but it grounds and makes intelligible all interactions between human beings. Pinkard then proceeds to elicit Hegel's account of the origin and development of Spirit from its most basic form -- in which the individual participants do not see themselves as distinct or separate from the whole in which they are embedded -- to its most complex, internally differentiated form -- in which individual participants wrongly think of themselves as estranged from their community. Pinkard completes his lucid account of the trajectory of Hegel's developing Spirit with the reconciliation of the beautiful soul and the moralistic judge, two opposed figures who have an "intuition" that their competing perspectives are actually "different versions of the same attitude" (128).

Moyar's fascinating essay also adopts a thematic approach in examining Hegel's view of Spirit. Moyar argues that Hegel's view of Spirit can be of great help to us in understanding the thorny concept of "alienation." Alienation is usually and inadequately explained as a mere subjective or psychological feeling or attitude, or as an objective phenomenon that requires a notion of "true consciousness" in contrast to "false consciousness." In examining Hegel's use of the concept throughout the Phenomenology and in the middle section of the "Spirit" chapter in particular, Moyar concludes that Hegel elicits both subjective and objective conditions for alienation that are grounded in a formal notion of agency. Ultimately, Moyar's essay is perhaps too ambitious in treating complex concepts (alienation, agency, intention) while also explicating a dense portion of Hegel's text all in a short essay. In Moyar's treatment of "Absolute Freedom and Terror," for instance, the transition from the bourgeois concept of "utility" to the Rousseauian "general will" is unclear. A utilitarian individualist like J.S. Mill, for instance, would argue that the appearance of a "general will" encompassing all individual identities is not the way to escape from alienation but precisely the path back into it.

Finally, Lewis and Pippin examine the final two chapters of the Phenomenology. Pippin's impressive essay, comprehensive in scope, is appropriate as an explication of the final section on "Absolute Knowledge," a section that has often vexed interpreters with its near oracular opacity. Pippin comes down ultimately on the side Fulda expresses in this volume, that is, that the "Absolute Knowledge" of the Phenomenology is not to be understood in the way that it sounds -- as a kind of gateway allowing passengers to enter the privileged realm of the Hegelian scientific system. Rather, the knowledge accrued at the end of the Phenomenology is more a knowledge of the limitations of our capacity to know, an awareness of the fragile interconnectedness of our normative judgments, a recognition of the openness and unpredictability of how our thought and action will be conceived in the future. Pippin's analysis of Hegel's notion of "action" and his application of this notion to a crucial passage in this final section of the Phenomenology are illuminating ways to help us address the puzzle of what Hegel took to be the distinctive accomplishment of the work as a whole.

In sum, this volume is a considerable contribution to the ever-growing literature on Hegel's Phenomenology. It is likely, however, to speak mainly to other scholars of Hegel and German philosophy in general. The essays are dense and demanding, especially for the Hegel tyros. The difficulty of the essays is, of course, not a criticism -- it is not easy to say something original and interesting about Hegel without assuming a good deal of background knowledge on the part of the reader. Moreover, those interested in the Critical Guide should not look to it as a kind of commentary on all the sections of the Phenomenology. There are few focused discussions on many of the key sections in "Consciousness," "Self-Consciousness," and "Reason." Yet, again, this is no fault for a volume that aims to accomplish what it does so well: to demonstrate that after 201 years Hegel's Phenomenology is still ground-breaking.