Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit: New Critical Essays

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Alfred Denker and Michael Vater, eds., Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit: New Critical Essays, Humanity Books, 2003, 359 pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 1591020565.

Reviewed by Thom Brooks, University of Newcastle


Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit is perhaps his best-known work, both well known for its influence on later philosophers as well as its apparent impenetrability. Alfred Denker and Michael Vater have put together a very interesting collection of thirteen essays that examine in detail every section of the Phenomenology. The pieces are written by a fairly wide range of both more established and younger scholars from Europe and the United States: in addition to the editors, Christoph Asmuth, Klaus Brinkmann, Paul Cobben, Richard Findler, Jeffery Kinlaw, Angelica Nuzzo,Tom Rockmore, Dale Snow, Ludovicus De Vos, Robert Williams, and Holger Zaborowski. It is worth noting that all of the contributors are far more ‘continental’ than ‘analytic’: the likes of Dudley Knowles, Terry Pinkard, Robert Pippin, Michael Rosen, Bob Stern, and many others are absent and hardly mentioned. Those fans of Hegel who are more inclined to, say, Rosen’s or Stern’s reading of Hegel will disagree with the ways in which these essays characterise Hegel’s various positions. Indeed, some may well find talk of ‘cultivated I-hood’ rather unhelpful and unnecessarily obscurant (p. 144). However, it is also well worth noting that the broadly similar perspective shared by all the contributors does lend a nice unity to the book, rare with most collections.

In addition, there are some real gems in this collection, most notably, Robert Williams’s fine chapter ‘The Concept of Recognition in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit,’ which maps out the development of recognition throughout the book, including the master-slave dialectic, as well as Hegel’s treatment of recognition in the family and in Greek tragedy (pp. 59-92). Williams does well to present a fairly comprehensive picture of the role recognition plays in the Phenomenology, as well as the implications for our study of the Phenomenology.

While I have some interpretive disagreements in general, I was also quite impressed by Michael Vater’s chapter examining Hegel’s apparent critique of Schelling’s philosophy in the Phenomenology (pp. 139-68). Of course, Hegel does not mention Schelling in the text, although it is hard to imagine that Hegel did not have certain targets in mind when setting out the problems he sees with rival schools of thought. Nor does he mention too many others, apart from odd references to Kant, Fichte, Jacobi, and a handful of others. Nevertheless, Vater makes a very convincing case for reading Hegel’s critique of empiricism as a critique of Schelling’s philosophy of nature — and the implication that Hegel, not Schelling, is the true proponent of ‘absolute idealism’ which both claim to advocate. Vater also does well to highlight Hegel’s use of ‘Spirit [Geist]’ as both substance and as subject.

Holger Zaborowski discusses Hegel’s early philosophy of history, a subject that has not been written on often enough. Of course, we often think of Hegel as a philosopher of history, yet base this on his later Lectures on the Philosophy of History. Zaborowski examines Hegel’s Difference essay, Faith and Knowledge, and the Phenomenology, picking out and providing a fairly convincing analysis that there is a philosophy of history to be found.

Where I part company is where Zaborowski regrets that the Phenomenology is too often understood to centre on so-called ‘epistemological issues’ leading to ‘a politically neutral counter-reading to politically oriented, or sometimes disoriented, readings of Hegel’ (p. 27). Zaborowski hopes that a proper appreciation of the development of Hegel’s thought on history will improve our understanding of his overall philosophy of history more generally. I must say that while I benefited from Zaborowski’s interesting analysis of Hegel’s essays in particular, I remain unconvinced that (a) we should avoid largely epistemological readings of the Phenomenology and (b) that a healthy respect for the early Hegel’s views on history will help us understand his more mature views. Indeed, Zaborowski never makes any attempt to make a case for these positions; he only asserts them as facts.

On point (a), why should we not understand Hegel’s project as epistemological? Indeed, Hegel tells us in the Phenomenology that ‘[i]t is this coming-to-be of Science as such or of knowledge, that is described in this Phenomenology of Spirit’ (G.W.F. Hegel, Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977), p. 15). Furthermore, we also learn in the Phenomenology‘s preface that ’the goal’ of Hegel’s project of speculative philosophy is ’Spirit’s insight into what knowing is’ (Hegel, Phenomenology, p. 17). Hegel is rarely as explicit as many contemporary readers would prefer, but there can be little doubt that Hegel did conceive his project in epistemological terms.

Now it is true that other contributors, most notably Ludovicus de Vos, are sympathetic to Zaborowski’s position. De Vos says that ‘Hegel does not do epistemology … He simply provides a Hegelian approach’ (p. 191 n5). But, again, there is no argument put forward to defend the position. Nor do we have good reason to think it an accurate way of understanding his project. Hegel most certainly does ‘do epistemology’ and not least in the Phenomenology. Finally, the claim that Hegel offers us ‘a Hegelian approach’ instead of an epistemological one tells us nothing, as it is a straightforward tautology.

On point (b), Zaborowski claims he will demonstrate why we need to understand Hegel’s early views on philosophy of history to grasp properly his mature views on philosophy of history. However, he does not spend much time laying out the connection between the two nor the importance of Hegel’s early views to his later views. Zaborowski does provide us with some interesting claims relating to Herder’s apparent great influence on Hegel’s views on history, but Zaborowski’s two-page treatment was too brief to really make out the case.

I would like to raise one final point. I was dismayed by the contributors’ lack of much interest in what Vater calls ‘the “old problems” that have bedeviled Hegel scholarship’. These ‘problems’ are ‘the double subtitle of the book, its ambiguous position vis-ˆ-vis “the system”, its different but overlapping book plans’ (p. 8). Vater claims that the contributors attempt new readings of the Phenomenology, taking the book as it is. To be honest, I think these ‘old problems’ are interesting because they remain true problems. On the one hand, I did enjoy reading the selections in this collection despite some of my criticisms and my more analytical reading of Hegel.

On the other hand, I do think this is a mistake. No serious discussion of the Phenomenology ‘as it is’ can ignore that its preface is not simply the preface to the Phenomenology, but to Hegel’s larger system. In other words, we must acknowledge the Phenomenology‘s relation to the system even when taking the Phenomenology ’as it is’.

It is quite true that not all the contributors share Vater’s views on this. In particular, I was struck by Angelica Nuzzo’s piece, which did look into the relation between the Phenomenology and the Hegel’s larger system (pp. 265-93). Nuzzo is quite right to argue that ‘the last chapter of the Phenomenology provides an essential relation … to the beginning of the Logic’ (p. 267, see p. 278). Indeed, the Phenomenology is, again, the preface to Hegel’s larger system: it makes the case for our need of speculative philosophy, which is then laid out in outline form in Hegel’s Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences. As Nuzzo says, ‘If philosophy is to be grounded as science, then Hegel’s chief concern is to show what the only possible form of philosophical knowledge should be’ (p. 268).

I also agree that ‘absolute knowing, for Hegel, not only belongs to experience, but constitutes its immanent structure as well as the condition of its “truth”’ (p. 269). Where I think Nuzzo oversteps the mark is when she says that ‘absolute knowledge’ is also essentially related to the ‘end’ of the Logic too (p. 267) or when she says that the ‘absolute’ is a ‘necessary result’ in Hegel’s logical sense (p. 279). Perhaps the Phenomenology is best known by Hegel’s own characterisation of the work as ‘the pathway of doubt, or more precisely as the way of despair’ (Hegel, Phenomenology, p. 49). Why is it a ‘way of despair’? Well, in essence, Hegel is trying to show that all known ways of understanding are flawed, that they fail to connect ‘knowing’ and ‘truth’ in a particular way. He begins with what he considers to be the worst view of understanding — which he calls ‘sense-certainty’ — and moves from one position to the next, each slightly more accurate than the one before yet all incomplete and inaccurate. At the end of the Phenomenology, we learn that we must ‘overcome’ what Hegel calls ‘the separation of knowing and truth … With this the Phenomenology of Spirit is concluded’ (Hegel, Phenomenology, p. 21). The Phenomenology is not itself ‘science’, in Hegel’s sense, but the ‘coming-to-be of Science as such’ (Hegel, Phenomenology, p. 15). That is, Hegel is making the case here for the need of a new way of knowing, his system of speculative philosophy. Talk of ‘necessary results’ is inappropriate, as is talk of ‘truth’. Truths and necessary results are the stuff of Hegel’s speculative logic where one movement follows the next, each a development of knowledge and truth. In the Phenomenology, we do not have an unfolding like this. Instead, we see one view of knowledge after the next until we are supposed to see the need for a new way of thinking about the world, setting the stage for speculative logic. The project of the Phenomenology and Hegel’s system are related, but quite different.

Other contributors weigh in on this debate as well and I disagreed with their claims. For example, Paul Cobben argues that dialectical logic is implicitly present in the Phenomenology, although it is explicitly stated only in ’Hegel’s mature philosophical system’ (see pp. 194-95). He says further: ‘The project of the Phenomenology is to systematically develop the conditions that must be satisfied …’ (p. 196). On the one hand, I agree with Cobben: surely, Hegel does not try to contradict claims about why various positions are problematic (or epistemology more generally) with the claims he will then develop in his system. If one is competent in Hegelian logic, there is no reason to think one will be unable to grasp the Phenomenology. That said, the Phenomenology moves from one failed position to the next. The system moves from one picture of truth and knowing to more comprehensive pictures. They are different, but related projects.

To sum up, I am critical of the readings of Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit by some of the contributors. And I do think there are some problems. However, anyone familiar with Hegel’s work and the literature on his work knows too well the highly contested nature of Hegelian scholarship. In addition, I should highlight again the fact that there are some real gems in this collection that are very useful, indeed.

All in all, the collection is very readable, it addresses the whole of the Phenomenology, and the contributions have a certain unity, born from their generally more ‘continental’ rather than ‘analytic’ flavour. I believe that anyone interested in Hegel’s Phenomenology will benefit greatly from engaging with this excellent collection, whatever their interpretive tastes.