Hegel's Philosophy and Feminist Thought: Beyond Antigone?

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Kimberley Hutchings and Tuija Pulkkinen (eds.), Hegel's Philosophy and Feminist Thought: Beyond Antigone? Palgrave MacMillan, 2010, 271pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230621459.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Gauthier, University of Portland


Appearing some fifteen years after Patricia Mills's groundbreaking Feminist Interpretations of Hegel, [1] this volume shows how far feminist scholarship on Hegel has progressed in that time. The anthology offers a diverse yet intersecting set of essays addressing both the significance of Hegel for feminist thought and the problems that his account of gender poses for feminists. While the earlier text brought together a set of previously published articles, Kimberley Hutchings and Tuija Pulkkinen's anthology consists almost entirely of new scholarship (only two articles were previously published, and only one before 2009). Moreover, with most of the contributors writing from a clearly continental approach to philosophy, and most having also been participants in two conferences dedicated to Hegel and feminist philosophy in 2003 and 2006, the new volume has a thematic unity that was lacking in the earlier anthology. The book is divided into two equal parts. The five essays of Part I engage the broad question of the relevance of Hegel for feminism, and those in Part II offer frameworks for interpreting Hegel's specific writings on women and gender in the Phenomenology of Spirit and Elements of the Philosophy of Right. The book concludes with the transcription of a brief e-mail discussion among Hutchings, Pulkkinen, Nancy Bauer, and Alison Stone on the significance of Hegel for feminist politics.

Perhaps the central point at issue for the writers in Part I is how to understand Hegel's dialectical system itself. For one group of interpreters, Hegel's description of the historical process of thesis being set against antithesis is best understood as disrupting the traditional Western notion of a concept's simply "being what it is" and constitutes a necessary precursor to the Freudian unconscious, deconstruction, and postmodern thought more generally. This leads to a largely favorable reading of Hegel's potential as a resource for feminist thought. For other interpreters, however, the Aufhebung itself represents the epitome of masculine metaphysical "totalization," the historical supersession of all that cannot be subsumed into conscious thought. This more basic theme is alleged to underpin Hegel's notorious contention that women have no role in public life and constitute an ongoing threat to rational political order.

This interpretive conflict emerges explicitly in the first two essays by Pulkkinen and Joanna Hodge. In advancing her ontological reading of Hegel, Pulkkinen criticizes Alexandre Kojève's phenomenological reading of Hegel's substance-subject as "consciousness," an interpretation that was taken up by Simone de Beauvoir. By contrast, Pulkkinen takes Hegelian ontology to provide "an inspiration for looking at gender not in terms of material ontology or the human condition, but as constantly transforming in the middle of a thought/matter process of materialization" (20). Pulkkinen draws upon Catherine Malabou's reading of Hegel's substance-subject as plasticity: a "capacity both to receive form and to give form to its own content" (26). She also favorably refers to Jean-Luc Nancy's interpretation of Hegel's ontology as implying an "eternal restlessness of thought" that resists all completion (28). For Pulkkinen, this places Hegel among the radical critics of foundationalism, a view that is in keeping with contemporary feminist criticisms of the Western philosophical canon.

In the very next chapter, however, Hodge avers that such an interpretation of Hegel would require a fundamental deconstruction of his overall project. Hodge offers an interpretation of Derrida's Glas that takes it to be such a deconstruction -- a "queering" of Hegel that refuses the latter's "completion of the speculative movement into the reconciliations promised at the higher level … in that drastic operation called Aufhebung" (42). Unlike Pulkkinen, Hodge reads Nancy's approach to Hegel as akin to that of Derrida, i.e., as an alternative to Hegel fashioned on the incoherence of his dialectic. On this account, while Hegel proposes a theory of the concept in which all that has gone past is taken up and retrieved in the later, higher concept, Derrida insists on an irretrievable "remainder" that escapes and disrupts the closed logic of Hegel's system (55).

Tina Chanter argues for a similarly closed logic in Hegel's approach to tragedy as she criticizes a "Hegelian impulse to reassert the unity that tragic conflict had disturbed" (65). In a sometimes dense and broad-ranging chapter Chanter argues for a fundamental link between sexism and racism in Hegel. She contends that the naturalness of slavery hangs over and informs Sophocles' Antigone -- a fact that passes without notice by Hegel. Chanter further explores what she claims is the "convoluted logic that allows Hegel to condemn slavery … and at the same time to exclude such practices as possible topics of tragedy" (64). She speculates that Antigone is disadvantaged in the text by her association with primitive gods of nature, as opposed to the "more advanced, more rational, more masculine, more Greek, more Christian, more Hegelian" gods of Creon. (70). This leaves Antigone, and woman more generally, incapable of true spiritual agency, consigned to a "liminal" sphere that is above the merely natural but removed from the world of the state and civil society (72).

Hutchings's essay provides a more positive evaluation of Hegel's reading of Antigone, taking up the implications of that reading for the ongoing debate between the ethics of care and the ethics of justice. Juxtaposing the approaches to Antigone in Hegel, Luce Irigaray, and Judith Butler, Hutchings argues for a common theme in all three: "the readings of Antigone in Hegel, Irigaray and Butler are alike in drawing out the impossibility of adequately expressing her ethical significance within the binary terms of divine and human law" (100). Hutchings draws together Hegel's writings on the tragic clash of the divine and human law in early Greek antiquity and those on other ethical dilemmas, including the clash between romantic and rationalist approaches to ethics in his own time. On her account, Hegel's approach is similar to that of later feminist ethicists who reject the self-certainty of the moral point of view and who work toward a non-dualist account of ethical action.

The final chapter of part I is a reprint of Butler's "Longing for Recognition," an essay in which she positively employs parts of Hegel's account of lordship and bondage in discussing Jessica Benjamin's account of intersubjective recognition.[2] Butler argues that Hegel develops an "ek-static notion of the self" in which the self must lose itself in the Other before it can return to itself. The return, however, is never to what the self was before the loss in the encounter: "The price of self-knowledge will be self-loss… . the self never returns to itself free of the Other" (124). As with the other authors who take Hegel's work in a positive light, Butler sees him as in line with contemporary theorists of sexuality and gender in defying a strict sense of identity and insisting upon a self that is outside itself.

The essays of part II focus more specifically on how to read Hegel's relatively few direct comments on women and gender relations. Although these essays approach the Hegelian texts from different stances, nearly all develop good reasons for thinking that the anti-feminist elements of Hegel's account of sex and gender are grounded in other aspects of his system and, thus, not easily explained away.

Perhaps the single exception to this theme is the first essay by Karin de Boer. De Boer questions whether Hegel intends the part of the Phenomenology dealing with Greek ethical life to offer a commentary on Sophocles' Antigone and whether Hegel is offering his views on gender relations there. De Boer relies on specific textual references from the Phenomenology as well as remarks in the Lectures on the Philosophy of History to argue that certain passages in chapter 6 of the former work are more likely to refer to the decay of Greek culture in Aristophanes' comedies and in Plato's Republic than to the earlier events chronicled in Sophocles' play. As such, the account of woman offered in the Phenomenology should not be read as Hegel's final word on gender relations, but as a more specific breakdown in Greek ethical life.

The following two essays by Rakefet Efrat-Levkovich and Susanna Lindberg also discuss a broader context for Hegel's allusions to Antigone in chapter 6, but by identifying hidden references to the feminine in other parts of the Phenomenology. For Efrat-Levkovich, Hegel's description of the emergence of self-consciousness from unmediated sense-certainty in chapters 1-4 contains an implicit reference to the feminine as that from which history begins but that is, in itself, ahistorical. The historical movement to concept-mediated consciousness relies upon "an effable consciousness for which knowledge of both the self and the other is impossible" (169). This ineffable, inarticulate, ahistorical ground of historical knowing maps precisely onto the myth of the feminine as described in the work of writers such as de Beauvoir, Kristeva, Benjamin, and Irigaray. Efrat-Levkovich contends, moreover, that once the Hegelian historical dialectic is unmasked as relying implicitly upon such an ahistorical ground, it is itself rendered unstable. Lindberg likewise takes the feminine to constitute an ahistorical and unacknowledged presence in Hegel's philosophy, but as a figure of absence that "does not constitute a moment of its own within the system" (189). Lindberg argues that "figures" such as Hegel's lord and bondsman or Creon and Antigone cannot be fixed in the manner of concepts or real historical individuals. Because Hegel does not acknowledge the existence of real, historical women in his system, he leaves us with only the figure of woman, "a figure of life, death, and love" (179). As the precondition of man's political world, she is situated above the level of the merely natural, but still lacking full political recognition herself.

The final two essays by Laura Werner and Stone form a powerful conclusion to part II (and the book overall) as they incisively assess Hegel's assignment of distinct gender roles in the Phenomenology and the Philosophy of Right in light of other aspects of his logic and metaphysics. Werner argues that although Hegel does not see distinct gender roles as simply natural, in contrast to writers such as Rousseau he also does not think that education is necessary to effect the distinctions. According to Werner, this is because the fundamental distinction in Hegel's logic is not between the biological and the socially constructed, but rather between Wirklichkeit and Realität; between "actuality" understood as the self-positing of the concept and "reality," a set of concrete observable differences (197). Although the latter are contingent on the former, the sphere of Realität encompasses both the biological and the cultural, allowing Hegel to speak of sexual and reproductive differences between the sexes as expressing the same functions as distinctions in social roles. For Hegel the "actual" difference between women and men consists in each one's logical relation to "difference" itself. While both male and female begin as an undivided unity, the male, in contrast to the female, is socially and biologically active -- "characterized by self-division and opposition" (204). It is through this (male) activity that the distinction between the sexes is posited. As Werner insightfully points out, however, it is only the feminine that can genuinely possess a gender "identity" at all as she lacks the necessary moment of self-differentiation that would take her out of herself.

While Werner grounds Hegel's account of gender in his logic, Stone emphasizes its deep roots in the closely related philosophy of nature. As in Werner's paper, Stone carefully distinguishes the metaphysical origins of Hegel's "naturalizing" of gender from biological determinism. She further argues that Hegel's positioning of woman in the "immediate" realm of the family rather than in the struggles of the public world (civil society and the state) finds its ground in female sexuality itself. In the Philosophy of Nature, Hegel symbolically identifies the male with the concept and the female with matter. While "the female retains the fetus within her own body, as part of her own physical processes … the male expels his semen outside him and thereafter has no further material, corporeal relationship with the fetus" (227). Given this background, Stone argues that the restriction of the symbolically "material" woman to the family under the headship of a man is not merely the result of historical contingency, but serves "the broader process of the spiritualization of matter" (228).

Taken together, the essays in the anthology make a powerful case both for the enduring importance of Hegel for feminist philosophy and for why feminists are likely to remain ambivalent about his legacy. As the concluding debate in the book makes clear, the importance of Hegel's account of mutual recognition on feminist theorists from de Beauvoir to Butler, the usefulness of historical dialectic in understanding political change, and Hegel's unyielding and consistent critique of dualism and binary thinking secure his place as an influence on feminist theory. At the same time, however, questions concerning the final goal of his dialectic and women's place within it still loom large. As Pulkkinen convincingly argues, the restlessness and inconclusiveness of Hegel's ontology is inconsistent with the ossification of any particular political order. On the other hand, Hegel himself seems to have taken the goal of his project to be one of "reconciling" his readers to the institutional structure of their times by demonstrating its rational development.[3] Even if such a conservative aim need not follow from his ontology, or is ultimately inconsistent with it, is that enough to reject it as "un-Hegelian"? Butler plausibly interprets Hegel's parable of lordship and bondage as implying that the self never possesses an identity but is always beyond itself. Yet to what extent can this attribution of self to woman be "Hegelian" when, as Stone and Werner argue, the restriction of self-differentiation to the male is deeply rooted in Hegel's metaphysics? If this volume does not offer definitive answers to these questions, it nevertheless poses them in a resourceful and original way and makes the book vital reading for anyone with an interest in feminist theory or Hegel's political philosophy more generally.

[1] Patricia Jagentowicz Mills, ed., Feminist Interpretations of Hegel (University Park PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1996).

[2] Judith Butler, "Longing for Recognition" in Undoing Gender (New York: Routledge, 2004), pp. 131-51.

[3] See for example Michael O. Hardimon, Hegel's Social Philosophy: The Project of Reconciliation (New York: Cambridge University Press), pp. 1-11.