Hegel's Philosophy of Language

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Jim Vernon, Hegel's Philosophy of Language, Continuum, 2007, 161 pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826494382.

Reviewed by Jere O'Neill Surber, University of Denver


Hegel's views regarding language have provoked a good deal of discussion and often controversy since about the middle of the last century.  Among those who have weighed in to one degree or another can be counted such well-known figures as Gadamer, Habermas, Ricoeur, Derrida, Deleuze, Lyotard, Nancy, and Žižek.  However, it would be difficult to describe any general contours or results of such discussions for two reasons.  First, Hegel himself never provided anything approaching a self-standing 'philosophy of language' that could be compared with his philosophies of art, religion, nature, politics, or history.  Rather, his views on language are expressed, in part, in several relatively extended discussions which form parts of other philosophical projects and, in part, in quite numerous comments and asides.  To complicate matters even more, both longer and briefer reflections occur over the entire course of his philosophical career.  Second, prior to the appearance of the present work, there has been (with one exception that I will mention later) no serious attempt to articulate what such a 'Hegelian philosophy of language' might look like.  As a result, such earlier discussions have something of the quality of dinner gossip about an absent guest, revealing more about the various parties' own preferences and prejudices than about anything that Hegel himself might have recognized as his own views.  Jim Vernon has quite bravely attempted to address this issue head-on.  He seeks, in an admirably direct and focused way, to provide a cogent account of language that at once bases itself on some of Hegel's more important passages on this topic, attempts to remain true to Hegel's overall philosophical project, and supplies some of the important connective tissue that Hegel himself either omitted or merely glossed.

I call Vernon's attempt brave because, as he himself well documents in his introductory chapter, the weight of scholarly opinion has quite decidedly inclined toward the view that articulating a coherent 'Hegelian philosophy of language' is a fool's errand.  There is, however, some considerable disagreement as to why this is so.  One view, which seems to be that of most of the first generation of scholars to broach this issue, holds either (or both) that Hegel's comments on language are too varied and diffuse, or (and) that they are insufficient to support anything that might approach a worked-out philosophy of language.  A second view, implicit in the work of most mainstream Hegel scholars, holds that Hegel was working in a tradition that (for better or worse) had not yet made 'the linguistic turn' and so should not be expected, any more than any pre-Hegelian philosopher, to have provided some well-developed linguistic theory.  A third, probably endorsed by many of the figures mentioned in the first paragraph, would claim that language, as the very medium of philosophy, is one (if not the only) thing that must perpetually defy any effort to include it within the conceptual architecture of a philosophical system.

Vernon's own view is that all three types of suspicion about such a project can be allayed.  As to the first, his entire project, rooted firmly as it is in Hegel's own texts, is, in effect, an attempt to demonstrate that there is an 'implicit' philosophy of language underlying Hegel's thought that can, in fact, be articulated.  The second (and this is where I most agree with him) is belied by the very fact that Hegel's linguistic views provide crucial and indispensable interventions at some of the key junctures of his thought, such as the opening sections of the Jena Phenomenology and the transition from representation to thought in the Philosophy of Spirit.  It is the third view that is, these days, most challenging to a project like Vernon's and it is this that forms the background of much of what follows in my discussion.

Let's begin with Vernon's own account of a Hegelian philosophy of language.  His initial approach is to situate Hegel's views on this topic in relation to some of Hegel's most important predecessors (starting with Kant) and to several other post-Hegelian thinkers (especially Husserl and Frege).  Already, with Vernon's selection of figures, we can anticipate the direction he will be taking.  Simply by omission, it seems that Vernon does not regard either Hamann or Schelling as standing in the intellectual line of a Hegelian philosophy of language.  Likewise, W. von Humbolt receives only a nod, in spite of the fact that Hegel refers rather favorably to him in several places, especially in a late but very extensive review of one of his works.

I highlight these omissions because they shed some (albeit contrasting) light on the claim underlying Vernon's entire account and, as he is suggesting, Hegel's as well.  It is that the necessary conditions for any cogent philosophy of language are that it account for a 'lexicon' and a 'grammar.'  (It is not entirely clear whether Vernon thinks these conditions are also sufficient, but it seems as if he does.)  In order to develop this claim, the author offers a very interesting reading of a speech by Hegel (1809) defending the study of classical languages in the Gymnasium curriculum of his time.  Vernon deploys his discussion of this text to suggest that the fundamental problem for any philosophy of language is that of 'language acquisition' and that what must be acquired is rather obviously a 'lexicon' of words (or, better, 'lexemes,' basic linguistically meaningful units) and a 'grammar' specifying the fundamental structural relations in which they stand.  Now, the author certainly has a lot of good company in thinking this (in fact, most of the background thinkers whom he mentions, especially Fichte, Frege, and Husserl) and I don't want to discount the fact that this tendency is certainly present within Hegel's linguistic reflections.  But it clearly suppresses another contrasting tendency that derives from Hamann and Schelling (and to a lesser extent the ideas of some of the Jena Romantics and Humboldt).  It is, in fact, the view that is most conspicuous in Hegel's first extended discussions of language in his Jena Lectures of 1804-6.  There, rather than adopting what might be called a 'logicist' or 'proto-structuralist' approach, Hegel emphasizes both the organic character of language, its protean and unique role in mediating between subject and world (or self and nature), and the essentially temporal and historical character of this process.  Framed in this alternative perspective, the individual's acquisition of language and the cataloguing of the structural elements needed to explain it start looking more like the empirical (or, dare I say, logical empirical) investigations that Kant himself had so derided as unworthy of philosophy.

The author's discussion of the 'lexematic' aspect of language involves a close reading of the famous section of Hegel's Encyclopaedia (Part I, Subjective Spirit) where Hegel is concerned to account for the transition from 'representation' to 'pure thinking' and within which he accords language a central role.  In fact, this section is the closest Hegel ever came to offering an explicit systematic account of language and Vernon's discussion of it is, to my mind, the best commentary available to date.  (There are others, but they are either too condensed, more concerned with their own issues than with Hegel's, or wander quite far afield from the texts and issues at hand.)  While I find little to disagree with (and much of interest) in the author's specific reading of this text, I think that he has muted some crucial issues in the way he frames the text in relation to larger philosophical questions concerning language.  I'll mention only one point here.  The author does not seem to be bothered by the fact that this most explicit and 'systematic' discussion of language occurs not just in a larger unit called 'Subjective Spirit' but, more specifically, within a subsection entitled "Psychology."  I certainly grant that Hegel's notion of psychology is a far cry from either that of Kant or later post-Hegelian projects, but his discussion here remains, nonetheless, at the level of the subjective and even the individual.  Of course, this accords well with Vernon's own focus on 'language acquisition,' but it suppresses the broader issue of whether Hegel's discussion here can be taken as consistent with other discussions of language elsewhere in his work, where he clearly regards language as functioning well beyond any merely subjective or psychological level -- even, as Schelling held, the ultimate, concretely existing 'Subject-Object.'

Vernon seems to agree that Hegel's treatment of language in these sections of the Philosophy of Subjective Spirit cannot be the whole 'systematic' story, since he finds it necessary to turn to the section of the Science of Logic entitled "The Concept" (die Begriff) to develop the second required part of a philosophy of language, a philosophical grammar.  Here the author's textual footing becomes a bit more slippery, since his general interpretive strategy involves, in effect, a translation of Hegel's logical categories and their interrelations into a sort of 'linguistic idiom.'  Such a project was already anticipated by Fichte's attempt to develop a 'speculative grammar' in the second part of his monograph on language of 1795, though Vernon, using Hegel's logical categories rather than the much simpler, essentially Kantian logical determinations with which Fichte was working, is able to push much further in this direction.  Vernon's efforts here are both ingenious and often novel, which makes this, perhaps, the most philosophically interesting part of his volume.  Still, the discussion as a whole ends up sidestepping two key questions.  First, why would (or could?) one not employ the same strategy for reading the earlier sections of the Logic (Sein and Wesen), instead of the section in the Philosophy of Subjective Spirit, in order to develop the 'lexical' element of a philosophy of language?  On Vernon's reading, it would appear that, systematically considered, Hegel developed (at least implicitly) a theory of grammatical relations prior to considering what sort of 'relata' they might have (words or 'lexemes,' of course, but those appear only much later in the system on Vernon's account).  Second, Vernon's extraction of a formal grammar from Hegel's treatment of logical determinations seems beset with a problem that has bedeviled other, essentially structuralist, readings of Hegel before him (the case of Hyppolite especially comes to mind): it turns on an implicit separation of 'form and content' that Hegel himself explicitly rejects from the very first pages of the Science of Logic.  The author is, of course, well aware of this problem, but I could not see how it might be avoided utilizing his preferred approach.

When Vernon turns, in his final chapter, to other thinkers (in particular, Gadamer and Derrida) who do not share his confidence that a systematically rigorous philosophy of language can be articulated on the basis of Hegel's (or, for that matter, any other) texts, the central issue at hand is already clear.  Such thinkers clearly stand in the line of Hamann and Schelling (which also passes through Hegel, although Vernon, as we have seen, suppresses this) that language is already a fully mediated, dynamic, and concrete 'subject-object' that any systematic philosophy of language will necessarily segment, truncate, and hence falsify.  On such an opposed view, language will always 'overflow' or 'outrun' any systematic or philosophical attempt to constrain it within the confines of a 'lexicon' and a 'grammar,' with the result that neither Hegel nor anyone else could succeed in such a project.

This leads directly to an important line of reflection that Vernon never directly confronts.  A crucial question that naturally arises about Vernon's enterprise is, "Why did Hegel himself choose not to articulate a philosophy of language?"  Certainly, by Hegel's time, there were several exemplars, such as the Sprachlehre of A. F. Bernhardi, a follower of Fichte, not to mention the work of W. von Humboldt.  And it is quite clear that Hegel was, in fact, concerned to rework other areas of philosophy (e.g. the philosophies of art, religion, politics, etc.) in order to show that they could be developed in a way that accorded them their proper systematic place within his thought.  If I may be permitted to speculate a bit beyond anything for which I have firm textual evidence, I would say that Hegel himself may have realized two things.  First, he was heir to, and in fact employed in articulating his system, two quite different and opposed approaches to language, the Fichtean 'transcendental' or 'structural' approach and the Hamannian-Schellingian 'language-as-concrete-totality' approach.  Second, when confronted with the choice of formulating a potentially problematic philosophy of language that could find no single determinate place in his systematic thought, or affirming his systematic project even if it could not accommodate a philosophy of language, he, in effect, chose the integrity of his overall system over articulating a philosophy of language that could potentially disrupt this broader project.  Perhaps, then, Hegel himself learned a lesson from earlier debates about language and declined the attempt to articulate an explicit philosophy of language because he realized that it was, in the end, a task that lay outside the scope of systematic philosophy as he understood it.

In assessing Vernon's attempt to do what Hegel himself declined, we should note, in fairness, that the very idea of a 'Hegelian Philosophy of Language' harbors a crucial ambiguity.  If one means by this an account of language based upon some of Hegel's texts and developed in a manner consistent with certain of Hegel's main philosophical tenets, then the author's account admirably fills the bill.  But if this phrase is taken to indicate a philosophy of language that would have a determinate place within Hegel's system (like his philosophies of art, religion, etc.) and whose internal structure would conform to all the criteria of systematicity that Hegel presupposes, then Vernon's account (and likely any other) is doomed to failure.

All this said, Vernon's work is an important one in numerous ways, not the least of which is presenting a clear marker, up to this point lacking, against which subsequent discussions of Hegel's linguistic views can be assessed.  As one who has long been intrigued by the possibility of articulating a 'Hegelian Philosophy of Language,' I began reading Vernon's work with great interest, but in the end it managed to confirm what had been my own suspicions all along:  that one can, perhaps, articulate an (or perhaps several) alternative philosophy(ies)  of language from a generally Hegelian perspective, but it (or they) will either only highlight one or the other aspect of Hegel's broader linguistic ideas or will end up violating Hegel's own idea of the nature of systematic philosophy and will hence be, at best, 'Neo-Hegelian.'  In the end, I think that Vernon's work, impressive as it is, manages to be a bit of both:  it neither does justice to the entire range of Hegel's linguistic thought nor is it entirely Hegelian -- in fact, I would regard it is as, in the end, more Fichtean than Hegelian.  Still, I know of only one other attempt to do something similar (that of Bruno Liebrucks in his multi-volume Sprache und Bewusstsein) and, of the two, Vernon's is by far the most explicit, focused, and helpful for further discussion.  I think it is fair to say that any future consideration of the theme of language in Hegel must take Jim Vernon's work as an indispensable reference point.