Hegel's Philosophy of Reality, Freedom, and God

Placeholder book cover

Robert M. Wallace, Hegel's Philosophy of Reality, Freedom, and God, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 380pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521844843.

Reviewed by Robert R. Williams, University of Illinois at Chicago


Robert Wallace has written a difficult but important book. He takes Hegel's logic seriously as providing the fundamental structures that constitute Hegel's position on the themes in the title: reality, freedom and God. His work on the logic, while falling short of a full commentary, is textually based, in dialogue with contemporary European and American scholarship, and original. It is also avowedly sympathetic and committed, advancing the opinion that Hegel merits serious study because he is closer to the truth than any of the alternatives in either the Anglo-American tradition or the European tradition.

Wallace advances the following theses: 1) Hegel criticizes rational egoism, and Kantian morality. Kant failed to overcome the dualisms between reason and sense, between noumena and phenomena, and thus does not succeed in offering an alternative to rational egoism. 2) Although Hegel criticizes Kant, he is also indebted to him and can be understood as completing the Kantian project of freedom as autonomous self-determination. This completion requires an ontological theory of self-transcendence and relation that goes beyond Kant's dualisms. 3) Central to this transformation and completion of Kant is an argument against dualism, which Wallace finds in Hegel's logic, to wit, the argument for the true infinite. This argument for the true infinite not only mediates the dualism between reason and sense, between ought and is, it is also an argument for God. 4) Wallace believes that Hegel's onto-theo-logic of the true infinite is sui generis, irreducible to either traditional theism or to Enlightenment naturalism and atheism, and yet manages to reconcile these apparent incompatibles in a more inclusive position. For this reason it has not been correctly identified, much less understood and adequately appreciated by either theologians or by philosophers. 5) These theses are not just a series joined by an external "and"; rather they are systematically connected. What ties them together is Hegel's concept of the true infinite. As Hegel contends and Wallace agrees, this "is the most important concept in philosophy." It grounds Hegel's critique of rational egoism and constitutes his argument for an ontological grounding of both relation and ethics. Even more central and important: Hegel's true infinite grounds and coincides with his view of the reality of autonomous, yet relational and social, freedom. It is also embodied in Hegel's concept of mutual recognition, which itself constitutes the grounding for the concept of right in the Philosophy of Right. The result of mutual recognition is a "We," to wit, a social infinite. Thus the true infinite not only completes the Kantian project of autonomy, it also includes the essential truth of Enlightenment naturalism, namely, its affirmation of freedom and rejection of supernaturalist dualisms.

Wallace's systematic proposal is both impressive and original; however it does not simply "drop out of heaven", but is a thoughtful response to recent discussions concerning Hegel's logic and its relevance for understanding his concept of the will and freedom, as well as recent discussions of Hegel's concept of recognition. Wallace does not seek to conceal the influence of two scholars in particular: Will Dudley and Paul Redding. Wallace continues Dudley's reading, to wit, that Hegel's critique of the Kantian morality position rests on Hegel's logical critique of the false or spurious infinite (or infinite regress/progress). As is well known, Kant's thought is structured around fundamental dualisms, e.g., the antinomies, the duality between reason and sensibility, between noumena and phenomena, between regulative and constitutive senses of ideas, e.g., Freedom and God. Hegel's alternative to Kant, the morality position, and to rational egoism, arises out of Hegel's alternative to the spurious infinite, namely the genuine or true infinite (die wahrhafte Unendlichkeit). Wallace identifies the true infinite as the sublation of the Kantian dualisms. In the true infinite doctrine Hegel reformulates Plato's response to the "third man argument" against participation and the Ideas. The third man argument turns on the mistake of construing an Idea as if it were a particular. According to Hegel, the key insight is that an infinite which is opposed to the finite proves by that very opposition that it is itself finite and has an other which it excludes. But the true infinite is not opposed to or competitive with the finite (as an opposite), rather it includes the finite in itself. Thus the true infinite dissolves the dualisms on which Kant's philosophy shipwrecks, and liberates freedom from these dualisms.

In an important footnote (p. 292) Wallace indicates that he agrees with Paul Redding's claim that Hegel's concept of recognition is grounded in Hegel's logic. Specifically Redding claims that the syllogism provides and indeed "is" the logical structure of the concept of recognition. Hegel himself declares that everything rational is a syllogism, and in the Phenomenology discussion of recognition explicitly identifies the structure of mutual recognition (but emphatically not the coercion and distortion of master and slave) as a syllogism. Here syllogism is not an argument structure of formal logic, but rather a triadic ontological structure and a process of reciprocal mediation that includes a moment of negation (master and slave) and a negation of negation (e.g. reciprocal recognition). The syllogism embodies and articulates the concept of the true infinite. Mutual recognition likewise embodies the true infinite as a social infinite. This social infinity can be plausibly read not only as Wallace does, as an argument against rational egoism, but also as an argument against atomistic individualism and political atomism, e.g., against the social contract theory of the state. (Hegel, Encyclopedia Logic §98). It can also be read as an argument against Cartesian idealism and solipsism.

The true infinite is thus the core of Wallace's reading of Hegel. His reading of this concept is both provocative and yet ambiguous. It is provocative because of the systematic way in which Wallace makes use of this concept to ground Hegel's concept of freedom, self-realization and the concept of recognition. But Wallace's theological reading of the true infinite is ambiguous and problematic. At stake is whether, as Wallace interprets it, the true infinite overcomes the dualisms he claims it does, or rather restates the Kantian failure or problem. The difficulty lies in the theology that Wallace ascribes to Hegel.

The true infinite is at once a thesis about human freedom in its self-transcendence and self-completion, and a theological thesis. Since Wallace construes it as a thesis about human freedom, he takes the starting point of Hegel's system to be not God but rather self-determination. (p. 8) God as absolute spirit is not the starting point but the system's final concept. To be sure, human freedom and God are not opposed, for according to Wallace, being self-determining means necessarily going beyond oneself, beyond one's finite characteristics, and Hegel calls the result of such self-transcendence infinite and divine. (p. 8) According to Wallace, Hegel does not assert that God is simply us, finite humans, but neither does he assert that God is simply something other than us (a power existing outside). (p. 8) In some sense then, human freedom and self-transcendence are divine, are God. This thesis seems to be similar to Feuerbach's reading that theology is reducible to anthropology.

However, Wallace denies that it is, and develops his interpretation as follows: "It is because Hegel combines a truth of traditional religion and theology (that finitude is only as a transcending of itself) with a truth of Enlightenment naturalism (that we can't intelligibly postulate two disparate and unrelated kinds of 'reality') into a coherent combination, that his doctrine is so unfamiliar that readers have great trouble simply identifying what it is. It is neither traditional theism, nor traditional atheism, nor pantheism, nor deism, nor Feuerbachian 'anthropotheism' because none of these does justice both to theism and to Enlightenment naturalism in the way that Hegel's doctrine does." (100)

Wallace's intention at least is clear: Hegel is not reducible to Enlightenment naturalism or Feuerbach because of his unusual way of understanding human freedom and self-transcendence. Wallace develops his first thesis that finitude is only as a transcending or going beyond itself principally at the level of anthropology. In Kantian language, self-transcendence means that reason is practical, is capable of determining its own ends. Wallace maintains that when we understand Hegel's argument about the true infinite correctly, it provides an attractive alternative to Kant's 's 'two worlds' or 'two standpoints' approach to the problem of freedom, while preserving what is most attractive in Kant's conception of freedom, namely, "its notion of transcending finite natural inclinations through unlimited rational questioning … . the same argument also underlies Hegel's idealism, his philosophical theology, and his ethical and social thinking …" (52) The problem arises when the true infinite is equated with God, and God is equated with the affirmation and transcendence of reason over the inclinations.

What is the content of the true infinite? Wallace repeatedly asserts that true infinity is only as a transcending of the finite. He claims that this does not reduce infinity to the finite because the finite achieves its own reality only through this transcendence. While Wallace sometimes suggests that relationship is what is fundamental to the true infinite (208), the problem is that relationship implies two relata, and this implies dualism, which Wallace, siding with Enlightenment naturalism and anti-deism, denies. The true infinite is a unity, but how is this to be understood? Wallace suggests that true infinity means that the infinite is the self-superseding of the finite and that the finite achieves reality through its self-supersession. Consequently "God's freedom can at the same time be human's freedom (self-superseding) and realization." (208). This seems to collapse the divine into the human. This suspicion is further strengthened when Wallace contends that the difference between religion as issuing from the human subject and as issuing from absolute spirit "is just a verbal one". (309) Finally in his summary conclusion, Wallace contends that the true infinite requires the non-dualism of human and divine being. This means that God is "the self-surpassing of humans" and that humans, in "going beyond ourselves" become God and thus in this sense achieve or realize freedom. We are 'with ourselves' and free "in God". At best these formulations are extremely ambiguous; at worst they are every bit as reductive as Feuerbach's reduction of theology to anthropology: the infinite vanishes.

These concerns can be articulated in three counterpoints: 1) Despite his appreciation of and his intention to do justice to Hegel's theology, Wallace is at a disadvantage in realizing this intention since by his own admission he has not studied Hegel's Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. As Walter Jaeschke (editor of these lectures) has pointed out, in the aftermath of the collapse of classical metaphysics and of theology as metaphysica specialis, Hegel confronted a stark choice: either concede that there is no basis for a philosophy of religion except a Kant- or Feuerbach-style anthropological account, or construct a new philosophical theology. Hegel chose the second and the result is his philosophy of religion, first sketched in the Phenomenology, and then elaborated more fully in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. At the heart of that project is the speculative reversal and speculative intuition, which involves a philosophical theology which includes some version of the ontological proof in terms of which God is anundfürsichsein, i.e., the non-existence of the absolute is impossible. This philosophical theology also includes a concept of divine self-divestment and divine-human unity or incarnation. This incarnational principle is found in Hinduism, Greek sculpture (Kunstreligion), as well as in the revelatory religion. In short, the content of these lectures are not restricted to Christianity as Wallace fears (313-316).

Hegel regards Kant's doctrine of God as a postulate of practical reason as one-sided and seriously inadequate. As a postulate God has no being an sich independent of the postulating consciousness. Thus, as far as Hegel is concerned, Kant's postulate of God is simply atheism. Kant restricts knowledge to finitude, but finitude itself has become absolute finitude and autonomy. "Thus what used to be regarded as the death of philosophy -- that reason should renounce its existence in the absolute excluding itself totally from the absolute and relating itself to it only negatively -- has now become the zenith of philosophy." In the Critical Philosophy's doctrine of the unknowable God, and unknowable thing in itself, and in its formalism in ethics, the Enlightenment apprehends its own nullity. Hegel rejects a non-religious, non-theological alternative of Enlightenment naturalism as fundamentally nihilistic (although he does not use that term).

2) Instead of maintaining that the true infinite is an idea projected or constructed by human freedom, Hegel rather maintains that it is not the infinite, but rather the finite, that is ideal. By "ideal" he means to grasp as relative, to cancel and preserve as a "moment" within a larger whole, to exist for and through an other. Hegel maintains that the ideality of the finite is the most important proposition of philosophy, which is why every genuine philosophy is idealism. (EL §95R) Here idealism is not epistemological but an ontological doctrine concerning the status of finitude. According to Hegel, the true situation is … that the proper determination of these things, which are … finite, consists in having the ground of their being not within themselves but in the universal divine idea. This interpretation must also be called idealism, but as distinct from the subjective idealism of the critical philosophy, it is absolute idealism. This idealism is shared by both philosophy and religion, which regards the world as created and governed by God. (EL §45)

To grasp the finite as relative to the infinite is to grasp its internal self-contradiction and self-nullification. This is to undergo a reversal, not only in thought, but also in the order of explanation. Although Wallace pays lip service to Hegel's doctrine that the finite is ideal, relative to and included in the true infinite -- and recognizes that this counts against naturalism -- he misses the fundamental speculative reversal and underestimates Hegel's rejection of naturalism. At issue is what is ground and what is result. What appears to be the result (God) is the logical starting point and ontological ground, while the original starting point (human freedom) is grasped as relative to and derivative from its ground. Without a sufficient appreciation of this speculative reversal -- which philosophy shares with religion --Wallace's interpretation of the true infinite becomes indistinguishable from Kant's postulate and Feuerbach's projectionist anthropotheism: "The key to understanding Hegel's concept of true infinity … is seeing that his critique of Kant and Fichte … overlies a fundamental agreement with Kant and Fichte about the importance of freedom as transcending finitude". (124-125) Compare this with Hegel's stern declaration that "a true hallowing should nullify the finite." (FK 65) This cannot be reconciled with any view of the divine as simply the self-realization of human freedom, or for that matter with any view of logic as a study of human thought and so reducible to psychology. Hegel's theology is not naturalism, but pantheism. The whole concern is to connect both nature and ethical life to God, to ground these in God while both preserving the ontological difference and avoiding ontological dualism.

3) Wallace's reading of the logic focuses on and privileges the earlier categories. He contends that in the system the most fundamental or germinal structures such as subject and freedom present themselves in the doctrine of being (Seinslogik) long before they are articulated as subjectivity as such or as the realm of freedom. (211) He believes that in the earliest categories Hegel establishes a pattern that the rest of his philosophical system doesn't depart from but only elaborates. (48) While this is not false, it does get the logical order backward, for it is equally true that the earlier categories presuppose and exhibit moves that become fully explicit (für sich) only in the later categories, especially the speculative reversal which is exhibited in teleology and end. However, Wallace tends to privilege the earlier form of the true infinite and slights the later forms.

This gives rise to a certain formalism in Wallace's reading of the logical structure of the true infinite. Wallace is correct that the true infinite resolves the problem of atomism and pluralism by overcoming the one-many dualism. This sets Hegel on the path towards syllogism and an organic conception of being which becomes explicit in the logic of the concept (chemism and teleology) and which even generates its own version of the ontological proof. However, the logic is not all that there is; there are also empirical realities 'outside' the logic. The logic is supposed to provide the structures for and thus explain those empirical realities (Realphilosophie). But this means that the logical categories such as the true infinite will appear embodied in different contexts and settings: Wallace tracks the true infinite and shows that it provides the structure of the soul, the will, life, ethical life, including social and political institutions, as well as the relation between God and world. But surely it is different on these different levels and in these different contexts. The latter are more than simple instantiations of the same fundamental structure; they are its different self-specifications and self-organizations. The speculative reversal is one important case in point. This is why in the logic itself, the great anti-formalist move -- the ontological proof -- gets discussed in the transition to objectivity, and not, for example, in the logic of being. These different intralogical and extra-logical contexts are important; they are not examples which merely instantiate certain 'unchanging' fundamental structures. In view of the centrality of Hegel's theology of the true infinite to his own systematic thesis, Wallace ignores Hegel's Philosophy of Religion at his own peril.

In spite of these reservations and concerns, Wallace's study, his systematic proposal concerning reality, freedom, and God the true infinite is original, provocative, challenging, and worthy of the strenuous effort reading it requires.