Hegel's Philosophy of Right

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Thom Brooks (ed.), Hegel's Philosophy of Right, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 212pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405188135.

Reviewed by Paul Redding, University of Sydney


For some time the contrast between the general reception of the practical philosophies of Kant and of Hegel within the predominantly analytic Anglophone philosophical community has been stark. To a contemporary non-specialist reader with a broadly analytic background, Kant's texts are difficult; nevertheless, in his case, a body of interpretation, criticism and defense has been built up by scholars who have succeeded in inserting Kant's claims into a framework from which his views can be compared and contrasted with other major figures in the tradition. So far, however, there has not developed to anything like the same degree an approach to Hegel that could weave his thoughts into contemporary debates in practical philosophy. Added to this, many have been skeptical of there being a point to creating an Hegelian voice within contemporary dialogues about morality and politics. While Hegel is a standard presence within "continental" philosophy, from the outset of the "analytic turn" in Anglophone philosophy in the early 20th century, Hegel has often been regarded as an instance of exactly the sort of approach from which a properly "scientific" philosophy should free itself. Of course, this negativity was not helped by the fact of two world wars in the first half of that century. Thus, by the 1950s, many of those primed on Russell's early polemics against Hegel were willing to nod in agreement with the sorts of alleged associations between Hegel and totalitarianism made popular by Popper and others, often on the basis of little familiarity with Hegel's texts.

In recent decades, as Kimberly Hutchings points out in her contribution to this generally Anglophone-oriented collection of essays, some of the ground has been clawed back so that "in mainstream Hegel scholarship, there is a broad consensus that Hegel can now be counted as one of the good guys" and that, his shortcomings aside, "he is essentially on the side of progress" (pp. 124-5). Furthermore -- and what may be surprising to those still of the Popperian view -- what is found to be at the heart of this "progressive" Hegel is his espousal of individual freedom. Of course "freedom" has been a much abused concept, and proponents of the older view might easily allude to the sign erected over the gate of Auschwitz 1, "Arbeit macht frei" ("work makes (one) free"). However, Hutchings and a number of other contributors to this collection are willing to argue a case for taking Hegel here at his word, and to advocate a view in which Hegel is seen as articulating a distinctive and valuable conception of individual freedom. This does not mean that Hegel is completely out of the woods. As Hutchings points out in "Hard Work: Hegel and the Meaning of the State in his Philosophy of Right" and Alison Stone in "Gender, Family, and the Organic State in Hegel's Political Thought", the "Hegel as totalitarian" image has come to be replaced by other similarly unflattering if less extreme images. If Hegel was a "modernist" in promoting the value of individual freedom, then the modernity he seems to have had in mind was still a racist, colonialist and sexist one. In his account of history, individual freedom had started off as a goal limited to a few, but was supposed to be headed towards a state in which it was to be realized by "all". In practice, however, "all" seems to have meant all European males, at most. I will return to these two essays and the issues they raise after, first, giving a sketch of the volume as a whole, and then, looking more particularly at how some of the other essays deal with each of the problems for the advocacy of some form of Hegelian political philosophy alluded to above.

The volume is divided into three parts, "Ethics", "Politics" and "Law". Part I comprises three essays: Dean Moyar's "Consequentialism and Deontology in Philosophy of Right", and two -- Fabian Freyenhagen's, "The Empty Formalism Objection Revisited: §135R and Recent Kantian Responses", and Robert Stern, "On Hegel's Critique of Kant's Ethics: Beyond the Formalism Objection" -- dealing with Hegel's critique of Kant's practical philosophy. Of course Hegel's critique of the formalism of Kant's account of "the supreme principle of morality" in Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals has been widely discussed, and many Kantians have fashioned defenses on Kant's behalf against these types of criticisms. Both Freyenhagen and Stern, in complementary ways, revisit Hegel's criticisms in the light of such Kantian rejoinders, taking these issues to a depth not commonly found in the literature. Both will be of interest to anyone who has thought about these issues. Moyar's more general and ambitious essay directly addresses the question of Hegel's political philosophy in the context of the contemporary mainstream. I will return to it below.

Part II comprises the essays by Hutchings and Stone mentioned above, as well as Thom Brooks' "Hegel and the Unified Theory of Punishment". Here Brooks argues against a unilaterally "retributivist" reading of Hegel -- a reading he sees as issuing from a lack of contextual sensitivity when locating the place of punishment within the Philosophy of Right. A second essay by Brooks, "Natural Law Internalism", forms one of the two essays of Part III. As in the earlier essay, Brooks helpfully locates Hegel within the broader tradition, here in relation to other, and contrasting, "externalist" approaches to natural law. While short, it provides a useful complement to Alan Brudner's longer and more ambitious piece, "Hegel on the Relations between Law and Justice". Again, I'll return to Brudner's essay below after some general comments on the volume as a whole.

While I think taken individually, the essays in this collection do live up to its cover blurb's description as "highly engaging and accessible scholarly essays", the first thing to strike this reader about the collection as a whole was the somewhat ill-fitting title. From the title alone, one might expect a rather differently structured collection -- one that comprehensively works through the component parts of Hegel's classic text -- rather than the collection of essays arranged in the way that I have described above. In his Introduction, Brooks makes the point that the distinctiveness of the collection is that "it is the first to speak substantively on these three areas" -- that is, ethics, politics and law -- the analyses of which in Philosophy of Right are "deeply interwoven" with elements of each other. "It is therefore difficult to substantively address even the majority of the Philosophy of Right and its rich array of arguments by only focusing on one particular area to the exclusion of others". And, he continues, "while the book may not address all topics it does seek to speak across a wide range of areas concerning Hegel's Philosophy of Right and to cover new ground" (p. 2). While I think it is correct to say that the essays "cover new ground", I'm not sure that, limited as it is to only eight essays, its range is particularly "wide". Perhaps a title such as Ethics, Politics and Law in Hegel's Practical Philosophy might have been more straightforwardly indicative of what is to be found within its covers. To my mind, the distinctiveness of this volume has less to do with its coverage of the structure and topics of Hegel's Philosophy of Right than it has with trying to find a place for Hegel within the history of political philosophy as seen from a contemporary point of view. From this perspective the collection gets off to a good start with Dean Moyar's "Consequentialism and Deontology in Philosophy of Right".

In this rich essay, Moyar directly approaches the question of the place of Hegel's political philosophy within a contemporary context by locating him within a framework of ideas drawn from Bernard Williams and Philip Pettit. The approach is to build an account of individual and institutional acting that sheds light on Hegel's motivations for structuring ethical life in the way that he does. Thus the deontological-consequentialist divide is used to articulate different ways in which philosophies stand to values: while deontologists are said to "honor" values, consequentialists "promote" them (p. 12). Moyar then treats the core value driving Hegel's philosophy as a Christian one: that "the individual as such has an infinite value", while focusing on the way Hegel is critical of the way in which this value is expressed in modernity. Here Moyar's essay blends into the theme of Hegel's Kant critique: it is, of course, the entirely "abstract" account of the individual in modern thought, and the corresponding "formal" account of law that are the targets of Hegel's critiques. These are factors that work to negate the differential particularity that might otherwise articulate the modern world in a way that Hegel favours.

In his efforts to translate Hegel's language into a more contemporary form, Moyar draws on recent pragmatist approaches to reason found in Wilfrid Sellars and Robert Brandom to bring out what he takes to be Hegel's alternative to standard modern accounts of freedom. Sellars and Brandom treat abstract principles as the results of secondary reflection upon "material" inferences, and Hegel's ordering of particularity and universality can be understood along similar lines. Particular values are needed to give practical inference a positive action output. Such are acts of "first-order" valuing, but such action contents are not self-conscious (and so not "free") if there are no second-order valuings at work. "Abstract universality taken by itself could recognize violations of freedom but could not account for determinate realizations of value. With particularity, determinate value comes into view but the subject's relation to the content could simply be given" (p. 18). Moyar suggests a model of "free material inference" in which the second-level valuing "cannot float free" from the first-level. This, he thinks, gives Hegel a response to those critics who think the value of individuals can be compromised for higher collective ones.

Moyar weaves this approach in with the role of intersubjective "recognition" within Hegel's philosophy, a theme also central to Brudner's essay, with which the volume closes. Brudner appeals to Hegel's approach to recognition to help reconcile the apparent contradiction between those passages in which Hegel seems to advocate a form of legal positivism and those which put him more in the camp of the natural lawyers. The path of recognition within Hegel's political philosophy is by now well trodden, although there is still much diversity within the various attempts to make it work. Brudner makes his point of departure the much discussed, but often misunderstood, master-slave scenario of chapter four of the Phenomenology of Spirit, and takes the discussion in an interesting and novel direction by using its resources to reconstruct an account of what he terms "authority's career" (p. 186). Right and duty are both products of a relationship, the ideal of which is the "mutual subordination between two worth-claiming selves, each of whom recognizes the other's end-status for the sake of the realization of its own" (p. 184). The realization of this "proceeds by stages through which the free agent progressively learns what the conditions of its realized end-status are. And this education of the agent to the conditions of its realized dignity is simultaneously the validation of the ideal form of recognition as the sole framework of valid worth claims" (pp. 184-5).

Brudner works through four forms or stages of authority from the recognitive point of view: de facto, de jure, legitimate, and constitutional authority, with the last being "the only authority to which a subject can surrender without loss of self-rule". This is

the authority of a public reason in whose legislative power the reasonable subject can participate and of which the ruler is only a minister and representative. By a public reason [is meant] a reason for submitting to rule that is universally and necessarily shared by beings possessed of a capacity for free choice and a potential for authoring ends. . . . For Hegel as for Rousseau and Kant, public reason is freedom, and Right consists of the laws that protect and promote it" (p. 202).

Here too, Brudner seems to be going in the direction of Moyar, whose invoking of Sellars and Brandom is directed to such pragmatic and social dimensions of reason. (One might also, of course, think of others: Jürgen Habermas and Onora O'Neill, to name just two.) For Brudner, this, however, shows "authority's development from despotism to constitutionalism [as] no more than its maturation from childhood to early adulthood. It is still far from the ripeness of old age" because "there are still several conceptions of freedom, each of which is capable of informing its own constitutional order" (pp. 204-5).

Brudner's analysis effectively ends here, at a point at which the worrisome elements of Hegel treated by Hutchings and Stone enter. Hegel may have been a modernist, but he was as acute a diagnostician as any conservative of the problems of the abstract forms of individual subjectivity unleashed by modernity. As Hutchings points out, Hegel poses the question of how the free individual can "recognize his or her freedom in the practices and institutions that make free individuality possible" (p. 131). Hegel sees looming many pathologies of reason here -- ones that Rebecca Comay's recent book on Hegel and the French Revolution makes vividly apparent.[1] The problem for Hegel is the genesis of a subject for which no existing form of practice and noexisting institution can be recognized as capable of supporting individual freedom. As Hutchings points out, from Hegel's point of view, freedom is "hard work", and "we have to give up on the idea that any practice of freedom is going to float free of dangerous implications" (p. 139).

Hutching's approach, looking somewhat more towards the "continental" tradition than most of the essays in the volume, seems more alert to such factors in orienting the reader to Hegel's philosophy. Thus she speculates that despite Hegel's own narrative about the development of freedom in the history of the West, his account of freedom might also become a candidate for the relentlessness of negativity charted in his logic:

The elevating of the principle of freedom is possible only through a unilinear reading of history in general, and modernity specifically. On this account, other histories and other modernities become beyond comprehension in their own terms. But this follows only if we universalize Hegel's thought in a way that runs contrary to his own account of the nature of his work (p. 140).

Thus while Hutchings cedes something to Hegel's post-colonial critics, she simultaneously responds to their criticism in what she sees to be an Hegelian spirit.

Something like this dispute is found in Stone's account of the overt sexism of Hegel's conception of the state as sketched in Philosophy of Right. Nobody can deny that Hegel wants to keep women out of the sphere that generates the dangers of abstract subjectivity: civil society. Here Hegel's diagnosis of the pathologies of modern life leads to his juxtaposition of the institutional sphere that is the inverse of that civil society, the family, and, of course, this is bound up with his differential treatment of women, who are primarily identified with this realm. As Stone points out, attitudes to this vary. Some defenders of Hegel, such as Jean-Phillippe Deranty, argue that Hegel's sexism just reflects the man rather than the philosophy. An opposing view (here represented by Allen Wood) sees the sexism as more entrenched as each principle is required "to have its proper representative and guardian".[2]

Stone's answer is inventive, but difficult to reconcile with the spirit of Hegel's political philosophy as presented by Moyar, Brudner or Hutchings. First, she focuses on what she describes as the "organic" structuring that Hegel gives to the state, quoting Hegel: "As living spirit, the state exists only as an organized whole, differentiated into particular functions which proceed from the single concept . . . of the rational will and continually produce it as their result".[3] "The state" she goes on, for Hegel "is an organism, that is the development of the Idea in its differences". But then Stone questions the model of "organism" that Hegel has in mind, suggesting (as did the romantics, Novalis and Friedrich Schlegel) that it might be better thought of as a plant than an animal.

Stone certainly knows the ins and outs of Hegel's philosophy of nature, but this diagnosis, when viewed from the perspective concerned with forms of recognition sufficient to universal freedom, seems to me confused. Stone insists that Hegel is not using the notion of an organism here as a "handy metaphor for the state. He believes that the rightly organized state really has the structure of an organism" (p. 150). But the idea that such "metaphysical beliefs" feed into Hegel's political philosophy seems to signal an account of Hegel that is at variance with those who stress the centrality of recognition to Hegel's idea of spirit (Geist) and freedom, or, like Hutchings, who want to read Hegel's exposition in terms of a tight nexus between "logic, history, and practice", stressing the radically self-transcending dimension of his approach.

As a collection, Hegel's Philosophy of Right is indeed a worthwhile addition to the growing reassessment on Hegel's political philosophy, although I'm not sure that it fully succeeds in the ambitious aspirations set out in the Introduction. There Brooks describes Hegel's text as one "whose analysis is deeply interwoven with elements of each area that speak to other areas". While here the individual essays to some extent succeed in "speaking to each other" (as mentioned, there are links between the approaches of Moyar and Brudner, as there are between Stern and Freyenhagen, and Hutchings and Stone), one also gets the impression that there may as well be quite significant underlying disagreements about the fundamental nature of Hegel's philosophy. The existence of disagreement here does not, of course, count against any volume like this, but it would have been clarifying if the degree to which these essays do or don't cohere had been explored. As is apparent here and elsewhere, Brooks himself is genuinely interested in the "deep structure" underlying Hegel's political philosophy, and in relation to this volume, the introduction may have presented an opportunity to do this. However, being less than five pages long, it is pretty well limited to presenting only the briefest of sketches of the contributing essays. Nevertheless, all in all this is an important contribution to the task of bringing Hegel's endlessly fascinating and controversial ideas to contemporary political philosophy.

[1] Rebecca Comay, Mourning Sickness: Hegel and the French Revolution (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2010).

[2] Allen Wood, Hegel's Ethical Thought (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990), p. 244. Quoted, p. 152.

[3] G. W. F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, ed. Allen W. Wood, trans. H. B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), §539.