Hegel's Rabble: An Investigation into Hegel's Philosophy of Right

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Frank Ruda, Hegel's Rabble: An Investigation into Hegel's Philosophy of Right, Continuum, 2011, 218pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441156938.

Reviewed by Adrian Johnston, University of New Mexico


In both his early Jena-era Philosophy of Spirit and later Berlin-period Philosophy of Right, Hegel highlights perhaps the sole problem for which he does not offer a solution. This arguably unique moment in the vast Hegelian oeuvre of a posed but not resolved difficulty goes by the name of "rabble" (Pöbel). With his solid grasp of British economics and the modern political economies of his time, one of the many fashions in which Hegel paves the way for Marxism consists in his realization that bourgeois industrial capitalism inevitably creates, as one of its necessary by-products, an ever-growing mass of immiserated people hurled into hopeless poverty. The objective alienation of this aggregate of dispossessed and disenfranchised poor, relentlessly produced without mercy by the mechanisms and machines of industrialization, creates the conditions for a subjective alienation embodied by the rabble, with its hostile attitude to the rest of society and brute sense of indignant entitlement.

Hegel suggests that the economic and political dynamics resulting in poverty, itself functioning as a breeding ground for the rabble mentality, are inherent to the then-new political economies of modernity (of course, he also highlights how the steadily widening gap between poverty and wealth under capitalism creates a corresponding rabble mentality in the rich, who come to believe that their gains contingently gotten through gambling on civil society's free markets absolve them of duties and obligations vis-à-vis the public spheres of the polis). Moreover, on Hegel's assessment, no modern society (yet) appears to be willing and able adequately to address this internally generated self-undermining factor of rabble-rousing impoverishment. Without doing so, these historically youthful collective systems are at risk of destroying themselves sooner or later. Hence, rather than marking a pseudo-Hegelian "end of history," such societies, Hegel insinuates, have a very uncertain future ahead of them.

As is common knowledge, the preface to the 1821 Philosophy of Right characterizes philosophy as "the Owl of Minerva" which spreads its wings solely at dusk, when the deeds and happenings of the day are done. In the same context, Hegel emphasizes that the philosopher is limited to gathering up materials furnished to him/her by the past and the present, constrained to conceptually synthesize his/her Zeitgeist and nothing more beyond this. Like the "angel of history" in Walter Benjamin's "Theses on the Philosophy of History," the philosopher -- Hegel doubtlessly includes himself here -- always has his/her back turned toward an unpredictable future (and this by contrast with the Marxist historical materialism soon to follow in Hegel's wake).

Given that the problem of the rabble is underscored in the text prefaced by these very remarks, the radical leftist Hegelian conclusion that, even for the author of the Philosophy of Right, capitalism faces the prospect of eventually doing fatal violence to itself at its own hands is hardly unreasonable as a defensible exegesis of Hegel's socio-political thinking. The defensibility of this is further reinforced substantially by the fact that Hegel, also in the preface to the Philosophy of Right, explicitly stipulates that the ability of philosophy to sublate the material of its times in thoughts signals the entering into decay and dissolution of the realities thus sublated; the sun must be setting when the wise owl takes flight. Consequently and by his own lights, Hegel's capacity to distill the essence of capitalist modernity heralds that the bourgeois social order of his age already is on its way off the stage of history. Taking into account the multiple connections between Hegel and Marx, the Hegelian Pöbel might very well represent, within the confines of the Philosophy of Right, those who will unchain themselves one fine day in order to expedite capitalism's twilight labor of digging its own grave.

Periodically in the mainstream Hegel scholarship of the past several decades, aspects of the above have received attention and commentary. Such scholars as Joachim Ritter, Shlomo Avineri, and Allen Wood have devoted serious efforts to pondering the questions and challenges raised by the Hegelian Pöbel. However, a number of features of Frank Ruda's outstanding study set it apart from its predecessors. To begin with, instead of treating the rabble merely as a curious sub-component of the Philosophy of Right, Ruda elevates it to a central position in Hegel's socio-political philosophy, inextricably intertwined with the entirety of the sprawling Hegelian system (even with such seemingly unrelated, far-flung moments as the depiction of matter in the Philosophy of Nature, the characterization of habit in the "Philosophical Anthropology" of the Philosophy of Spirit and the logical treatment of the modalities of necessity and contingency). Related to this, Hegel's Pöbel, on Ruda's reading, represents the immanently (self-)determined limits of Hegelian political philosophy. Put differently, for Ruda, the rabble is a marker for a political problem irresolvable within the parameters of (political) philosophy. This thesis is of a piece with Ruda's quite convincing efforts to reduce the gap between Hegel and Marx by showing how the former, even in his particular blindnesses, already foreshadowed the latter more than is usually acknowledged by either Hegelians or Marxists. Marx's ostensibly anti-Hegelian recasting of the relations and priorities of philosophy and politics with respect to one another is, on this interpretation, actually a consequent extrapolation from Hegel's framing of these topics in the Philosophy of Right.

Another distinctive feature of Hegel's Rabble is that Ruda's considerations regarding the transition from the Hegelian Pöbel to the Marxian proletariat are profoundly informed by current perspectives in leftist thinking, especially the work of philosophers Alain Badiou and Slavoj Žižek (the latter wrote the foreword to Ruda's book). Before addressing the Badiouian and Žižekian aspects of this project, I should mention two other contemporary authors Ruda relies on (as do Badiou and Žižek) from time to time: Jacques Rancière and Giorgio Agamben. Ruda blends Rancière's notion of "the part of no part" (as a segment of society with no acknowledged shares and stakes in the very society of which this segment is a structurally integral component nonetheless) with Agamben's biopolitical figure of "homo sacer" (as "bare life" manipulated by the operations of biopower, a status to which all inhabitants of biopolitical poleis are, in virtual potentiality if not real actuality, reduced) in his elucidations of the status of the rabble. Although this sort of move might raise concerns about anachronisms (especially among more conservative Hegel scholars), Ruda persuasively shows how such Rancièrian and Agambenian motifs really are strikingly foreshadowed by Hegel's renditions of the rabble. Of course, Rancière and Agamben forge these ideas with their eyes on, among other things, Hegelian and Marxian backgrounds (a point to which I will return when raising some questions for Ruda).

In particular, Ruda's interpretation reveals the Hegelian Pöbel to be an apparently exceptional particular moment of modern bourgeois societies representing, in truth, a universal dimension cutting across the myriad distinctions and divisions of these otherwise highly stratified social systems. In collective orders organized around the casino-like anarchy of the marketplace, anyone is, at a minimum, virtually rabble. That is to say, under capitalism, everyone is at least potentially a member of this "part of no part," exposed to the permanent risk of falling into the darkness of this state of internal exclusion (à la Jacques Lacan's concept of "extimacy" qua inner or intimate exteriority). Related to this, insofar as the rabble is stripped of all distinguishing status symbols and denied social recognition within the hierarchized distribution of economic roles and political positions, it stands within modern societies for the zero-level of sheer, bare humanity. Ruda links the implicit, in-principle universality of mere, minimal human being to the "species-being" (Gattungswesen) of the young Marx's 1844 Economic and Philosophical Manuscripts. Based on this, he argues that Hegel's rabble, legitimately re-read without anachronism through the lenses of Marx and certain of his contemporary heirs (specifically, Agamben, Badiou, Rancière, and Žižek), (1) prefigures today's scattered populations of the diverse multitudes marginalized by late-capitalist globalization, and also (2) embodies a spur for the formulation of a new humanism supporting a radically egalitarian politics leading beyond capitalism (I will address Ruda's references to humanism below ).

Badiou's theory of the event, particularly as it gets recast in his 2006 Logics of Worlds (the sequel to 1988's Being and Event), clearly provides Ruda with a platform for rethinking the odd position of the rabble in Hegel's philosophy as a precursor of the revolutionary proletariat of Marxism. On Ruda's reading and in Badiou's parlance, the Hegelian Pöbel is the "inexistent" (i.e., that which neither is visible nor counts for something) of the "world" (i.e., the intrinsic structure and dynamics of an established context) of modern bourgeois societies as dominated by the capricious and chaotic free flows of capital. For Badiou, if and when a given world's inexistent, which ontologically subsists within its surrounding world without "phenomenologically" appearing therein, erupts above the threshold of visibility, it inevitably brings about a reordering of the worldly "distribution of the sensible" (to borrow another turn of phrase from Rancière). Such eruptions are Badiouian events -- namely and in wording resonant for anyone familiar with the Marxist tradition: revolutionary upheavals changing the world thanks to those who are nothing demanding to count for everything. Likewise, Ruda, obviously with his mind on the Marxism situated in-between Hegel and Badiou, identifies the rabble of the Philosophy of Right as the potential locus (in Badiouese, an "evental site") for dramatic transformations of those societies Hegel hints are innately self-subverting and already on the wane.

Žižek's influence, like that of Badiou, is omnipresent throughout Hegel's Rabble. Žižek is responsible for a sustained and sophisticated reinterpretation of Hegel turning many of the orthodox, textbook tenets regarding Hegel's philosophy on their heads. The Žižekian Hegel is a materialist philosopher privileging real contingency over logical necessity. Moreover, from Žižek's perspective, Marx and the vast majority of his followers severely underestimate the size of the "rational kernel" of Hegelianism relative to its purported "mystical shell." Ruda's narrowing of the divide between Hegel and Marx, with the rabble of the former anticipating the proletariat of the latter, looks Žižekian in inspiration. From one angle, Hegel's Rabble can be seen as at the vanguard of a new kind of meticulous Hegel scholarship carefully deploying the insights and resources furnished by Žižek's innovative "return to Hegel."

Finally, two lines of questioning: the first apropos Ruda's contemporary influences and the second apropos humanism. Agamben, Badiou, Rancière, and Žižek differ from (and often disagree with) each other particularly in relation to the topics of the economy and class as colored by Marx's legacy. Most importantly, whereas the first three, each in his own manner, take their distances from the more classical version of historical materialism as based on references to economic forces and factors, Žižek vehemently calls for a renewal of the historical materialist critique of political economy as per the Marx of Capital. Ruda obviously is aware of these differences. For example, in an endnote, he provides a remarkably succinct and lucid summary of the key incompatibilities between the philosophies of Agamben and Badiou.

However, he does not clearly and directly confront the tensions between Badiou and Žižek -- these two principal supports of his endeavor are in open disagreement about the rapport between economics and politics -- and thereby leaves unanswered a number of questions: How tightly tied, if at all, is the rabble, which itself arises from a contingent shift of attitude and can manifest itself amongst the rich as well as the poor, to a particular socio-economic class position? In a related vein, how is the Marxian proletariat prefigured by Hegel's Pöbel to be understood (for instance, in relation to "the working class")? Is the rabble just the necessary or also the sufficient condition for revolutionary events? Overall, to what degree(s) are the objectively real dialectics of social history from Hegel's era to the present driven primarily by the economics of capitalism? In old-fashioned Marxist parlance, one of the main bones of contention between Badiou and Žižek is the base-superstructure distinction. I suspect Ruda is somewhat more sympathetic to Žižek's insistence on the continued tilting of the unevenness of dialectical social dynamics in late-capitalism toward the economy as being politically decisive (at least "in the last instance"). But, I am not one-hundred-percent certain of this. One thing I am sure of is that Ruda indeed has answers to these questions. His future work, I hope, will speak to them.

As for the theme of humanism, Ruda, unlike so many theorists shaped by twentieth-century French philosophy, refreshingly rejects the Althusserian thesis positing a Bachelardian-style "epistemological break" in Marx's intellectual development allegedly occurring in 1845 with the "Theses on Feuerbach" and The German Ideology. In connection with this (and as noted above), Ruda seeks to press the early Marx's concept of Gattungswesen into the service of a Badiouian (in)humanism, namely, a humanism of human beings qua (self-)voided animals, of human nature as auto-denaturalizing through the subject-object interactions set in motion by social labor (itself initially dictated by natural circumstances and pressures). However, is this humanism really new, or is its apparent newness an effect generated by a failure to appreciate what already is contained within humanism's canonical sources? For example, Agamben, in his book The Open: Man and Animal, astutely highlights the extreme character of Pico della Mirandola's depiction of humanity's peculiarity in his 1486 oration "On the Dignity of Man." This founding document of Renaissance humanism arguably had already outlined the picture of human nature Ruda extracts from his Badiou-motivated circumnavigation back to Marx's 1844 Manuscripts. Admittedly, Ruda quickly sketches all of this at the very end of Hegel's Rabble. I am eager to see how he will develop this and, in the process, narrate a convincing novel history of humanism in which the continuities and discontinuities from the fifteenth century through today will come sharply into focus.

Hegel's Rabble succeeds marvelously at revivifying Hegel in the early twenty-first century. Ruda's carefully argued and well-supported reconstruction of Hegel's Philosophy of Right as embedded in the Hegelian edifice as a whole challenges received wisdom about Hegel himself and Marx's relations with him. It also brilliantly illuminates the main problems at the heart of contemporary leftist socio-political theorizing. Ruda has made a major contribution to both Hegel scholarship as well as current discussions of Marxism and post-Marxism. Hegel's Rabble is mandatory reading for anyone interested in Hegel and radical leftism today.