Hegel, the End of History, and the Future

Placeholder book cover

Eric Michael Dale, Hegel, the End of History, and the Future, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 256pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107063020.

Reviewed by Laurence Dickey, University of Wisconsin-Madison


On many levels Eric Michael Dale's book is impressive. It speaks well of his basic intelligence and the broad scope of his interests. Moreover, it shows him to be a curious and careful scholar as well as a talented writer who is capable of providing readers with clear expositions of Hegel's (and others) complex thinking. I admire these qualities of mind greatly. And I think it took academic courage to write this book the way it is written.

The scope of Dale's work, however, is too broad -- that is to say, it is overfull and goes off in so many different directions and covers so many different thinkers and topics that it is difficult to review without neglecting themes that Dale has deemed central but which, to my mind, are not essential to advancing his overall thesis about Hegel as a thinker. In the face of this difficulty my review focuses on the general interpretive framework in which Dale situates Hegel's philosophy. He is very clear about this, arguing that Hegel belongs less to the great transcendental philosophical tradition that started with Plato than to a tradition of immanent teleology that began with Aristotle.

Students of philosophy often begin discussion of the history of their field by positing an opposition between Plato and Aristotle. In these studies, the general trust is to set a clear opposition between Plato's transcendentalism and Aristotle's immanentism. In the former, transcendental being or the transcendental source of order in the world or the paradigmatic realm of ideas is separate from, and independent of human experience. In the latter, the idea of a separate realm of transcendental existence or essential being is rejected in favor of an immanent conception of being that derives its form and direction in life from the natural and intellectual forces of man's mundane existence.

Dale begins by making several claims around which he organizes his book: (1) that Hegel's philosophy is best understood in Aristotelian terms (3-6); (2) that Hegel "should . . . never be read . . . as a Platonist" (4); (3) that Hegel "like Aristotle" is a thoroughly "teleological" thinker who holds an "immanent" conception both of man's being and of historical "progress" rather than a transcendental conception of his being and of historical progress (3-4); and (4) that Hegel's understanding of progress in history is governed by an "Aristotelian fascination" with the "inner workings" of natural processes and human generated outcomes in history rather than by a "Platonic interpretation" of historical progress in which a transcendent spirit guides man through history towards a preordained teleological end (4).

With these declarations in place, Dale admits that, although Hegel's "language and images" have been commonly interpreted as those of a "philosopher of transcendence" (4), Hegel's true greatness lies in his realization of two things: that grounding dialectic in history means that "everything that happens of any import [in history] is immanent" (4); and that "contingency" is real and must be accounted for as such by philosophy (7-10). Dale then maintains that Hegel's great failure was to think he could "eliminate" contingency as a philosophical problem by developing a philosophy of spirit that "dialectically" overcame it (7-10). However, in dealing with "mediation, finitude and contingency" (10), Dale thinks Hegel did much to advance our understanding of how natural processes are interconnected in the realm of history. In this, he holds that Hegel's contribution to modern philosophy lies in enlarging its sense of the infinite possibilities of the human spirit rather than in encouraging it to prematurely foreclose upon those possibilities (4-5 167, 204, 208, 233).

According to Dale, Hegel's understanding of natural processes rests upon an Aristotelian foundation. This, he continues, constitutes Hegel's success as a thinker. First, because his realism and openness to history as a process of change gives the lie to the "myth" that the "end of history" is the defining feature of Hegel's philosophy (3, 5, 9, 179). And second, because it brings Hegel's philosophy into line with an emerging tendency in Hegelian scholarship that reads Hegel as a basically Aristotelian rather than a Platonic thinker (170).

Previewing the purpose of his book, Dale says his study draws attention to this Aristotelian "counter-trend" in Hegel's thinking, a trend that pits "Hegel contra Hegel" (5-10). In this, Dale characterizes his project as an "apologetic" (10) since it seeks to rescue Hegel not only from his wrongheaded philosophy of spirit but from transcendentalism and Platonism as well. But as Dale carries out his rescue operation he actually engages in a (Feuerbachian-like) exercise whereby Hegel's transcendental spiritualism is reduced to, or grounded in a form of human existence or non-theological anthropology that is consistent with Aristotle's (and Feuerbach's) de-divinized conception of man's immanent nature. More specifically, the reduction naturalizes Hegel's idea of spirit by suggesting that transcendental things are anthropological projections (Feuerbach) or duplications of essences or potentials that already exist in immanent form in human nature (Aristotle) (4).

The problem with this procedure is that it reverses the upward direction spirit moves in Hegel's hierarchical understanding of the various realities through which spirit passes as it rises from an immanent natural to a transcendent spiritual condition of being. Dale admits that "self-transcendence" (188) is a basic axiom of Hegel's thinking. He concludes, nevertheless, that, "apart" from Hegel's concerted effort to re-spiritualize human nature (9), it is Hegel's "deeper dialectical-historical commitment" to the principles of immanent being that constitutes, in Dale's mind, Hegel's greatness (197). So, besides wishing to dismiss the "top-down" transcendental aspect of Hegel's philosophy (4), Dale also wishes to level down the bottom-up movement in Hegel's hierarchy of being so that Hegel's idea of ascending spirit in history is shut off.

The upshot of Dale's redirection of Hegel's philosophy is that Hegel's religious views -- which Dale recognizes when he says Hegel was "always a Christian speculative" philosopher (163) whose "project [was to bring together] the mundane and the sacred, the human and the divine" (173) -- are discounted by Dale in order to begin his Hegel contra Hegel argument. As a corollary of that move, the very idea of a transcendental being (e.g., God) can be discounted as flawed thinking because it allows for supernatural causation (e.g., God's exercise of His providence) to play a role in the world -- in the organization of the natural world (i.e., the argument for design) and in the spiritual world of human beings whom God wishes to redeem. By denying the possibility of supernatural causation, Dale aligns himself with thinkers and scholars who are more interested in anthropologizing the idea of God than in spiritualizing or re-divinizing man. In the former, man's being is grounded in what Dale calls man's "immanent self-becoming" (165) and in man's conscious spiritual "self-becoming" (185). In the latter, the becoming of human beings is directed towards the single divinely preordained end or purpose or goal of reconciliation with God (197). Thus, because Dale identifies Aristotelian immanentism as the basis of the "counter-trend" in Hegel's philosophy, he can treat God and/or providence as projections and dismiss them as supernatural causal agents that move human beings through history and towards their salvific end. That also means Dale can now interpret what he calls Hegel's "rational plan of history" (165) not as the result of providential activity or as something "transcendental[ly] given" (213) but as consistent with an "Aristotelian formal-final cause" argument about spirit and man's spiritual self-becoming (165, 209-217). Hence his statement, "Hegel's assumption of reasonableness in history is another manifestation of his Aristotelian openness to the world" (179).

Given that Dale organizes the main lines of his Hegel contra Hegel thesis around the opposition between transcendentalism and immanentism, he cannot avoid repeatedly leveling down everything Hegel says about the spiritual and religious lives of human beings to something more natural and mundane. He does this time and again, with the result that he has to argue that, when Hegel is talking about God or divine providence or Geist, he is really talking about "this-worldly" (232) things. As Dale notes, "Even at his most theological, Hegel is always talking about humanity; this cannot be said often enough" (190). And, amplifying on that, he cautions against getting "caught up in Hegel's theological language [because] . . . Hegel is doing Hegelian philosophy not Christian theology" (190). Dale calls his inversion of Hegel's language (10) "a more humble reading of Hegel," one that corrects the "received Hegelian orthodoxy" that sees Hegel as "a philosopher of transcendence" (4).

At least four major themes in Hegel's work are discussed by Dale along these reductionist lines of interpretation. To this end, Dale talks about: (1) Hegel's "God-language" (231) -- which includes discussion of related themes such as revealed religion, the relationship of Geist to the Christian notion of the Holy Spirit (189-90, 210) and the "cunning of reason"; (2) the "plan-language" Hegel uses while discussing the activity of divine providence in the world (165); (3) the role the movement of spirit from east to west plays in Hegel's concept of freedom; and (4) "what sort of ends count" for Hegel when the subject is "the end of history" (206).

With regard to the first point, Dale says Hegel "insists on using God-language" to express the main aim of his philosophy because Hegel's Christian audience believed in it (165, 172) and because he himself wished to "reconcile" God with history on the one hand and man with God on the other (173, 189, 196, 231). Dale claims, however, that Hegel's God-language is only "partially theological" (165), for it is not meant to "describe some transcendental, other-worldly (plan of salvific) action" that had been initiated and controlled by God through providential activity in history (165). Rather, Dale argues, the God-language is a metaphor for the "immanent self-becoming" of spirit in history (165, 213). Spirit's becoming, therefore, becomes an immanent process for Dale. That process, in turn, provides humanity with the "impetus towards freedom in history" (209). As such, man's freedom and autonomy is not actually connected to "some hyperreal transcendental agent" who governs human behavior in history (209). Man is free and open to whatever the future holds. He is now, as it were, his own maker.

Having put Hegel's God-language in these terms, Dale can fold the idea of God and His providential plan for human salvation into what we earlier saw him call "the Aristotelian formal-final cause of spirit's becoming." Through the temporal process of immanent self-becoming, Dale argues, man "'achieves'" himself -- that is to say, man's life can now be interpreted in terms of a series of formal-final causes that are "given" by man to himself at different moments in history (211). Again, Hegel's "basic Aristotelian openness . . . to the future and its possibilities" is the key to Dale's interpretation (3, 9, 179), for openness implies that man's spiritual self-becoming "is [always] yet to be determined" and has, therefore, "no 'particular end'" attached to it such as reconciliation with, or "ascent to God" (220). For Dale, then, Hegel's concept of the future is not only indeterminate but also always the result of "human, not . . . transcendent" activity (210). For that reason, Dale aligns Hegel with Aristotle (209), declaring both thinkers to be immanentists who hold views of man's end or purpose that stress the "infinite" and never to be foreclosed possibilities of human nature (223, 204).

Dale's treatment of divine providence (as well as the idea of the "cunning of reason" (e.g., 209)) runs in the direction of immanentism, too, for what starts out with his acknowledging Hegel's frequent discussions of divine providence as the agent of God's will in history (210), concludes with Dale stating that, ultimately, "Hegel gives divine providence an immanent, this-worldly" focus (232). And that statement comes just after Dale has told us that the idea of God in history has less to do with the very old biblical idea of a "living God" who works in history to save man than with sanctioning immanent processes as autonomous carriers of God's "aim[s] and purpose[s]" (210). Dale says things like this because he thinks Hegel identifies "reason with God" (210) and because he thinks "the plan of reason" in history is "interchangeable" with the "plan of divine providence" (165, 181-84). Needless to say, connecting God, providence and reason this way blurs the line between human and divine knowledge. But this allows Dale to conclude that, when Hegel (196) says "'religion has its seat and soil in the activity of thinking'" (196), he is reducing theology to anthropology rather than referring to the indwelling of the divine spirit in man that operates through the thinking part of the soul (e.g., phronesis in Plato's philosophy) and gives human beings access to a higher spiritual reality. This grounding of religion in anthropocentric thinking, Dale goes on to say, shows Hegel to be following Aristotle (165 183-4) insofar as the latter had said -- as a down-to-earth alternative to Plato's conception of phronesis -- that the substance of divinity was what man, "thinking upon [his own] thinking" (165), produces as an object for his thinking. In the phrase, Hegel contra Hegel, the first Hegel reclaims for humanity what the second Hegel had "hypostatized" as a transcendental being who governed history through his providence.

From, say, a Feuerbachian perspective, Dale's Hegel contra Hegel thesis makes sense, but only if it succeeds in persuading us that what Dale calls the "ontotheological" (231) direction of Hegel's thinking (i.e., that which rises upwards toward God through an ascending series of ends that mark man's teleological progress towards completing himself as a being created in the image and likeness of God) can be reversed and explained in terms of Aristotle's notion of practical (i.e., non-transcendental) prudence. It is hard for me to envisage Hegel signing on to such a project. His anthropology, after all, was theological and turned on the issue of whether or not human beings could live above themselves in two senses: the religious sense of striving to reconcile themselves with God by ascending to Him; and a teleological sense by linking their sense of end and purpose to imitation of a divinely ordained theonomic ethic.

In addition, Hegel seems to me to have been committed to a quite different threefold project: to getting God into the world and to making that "living God" a constant and constructive force in the lives of human beings; to explaining how God, in His capacity as the Lord of history, used His providence to preserve life through the "economy of nature" and to perfect life through the "economy of the soul"; and to showing how this twofold function of providence allowed God to use providence as a pedagogical resource to guide human beings towards salvation in accordance with the so-called "economy" of His plan for human salvation. As any number of scholars have recognized, the overall result of viewing the economy of divine providence in this twofold way was a theological anthropology in which the economy of spirit -- much like the motion of Plato's soul -- lifts man from a finite to an infinite plane of existence in order for man to complete/perfect himself by assimilating to God. A major shortcoming of Dale's work is that it fails to discuss the double functionality of providence's so-called terrestrial immanence.

When viewed from the vantage point of the economy of divine providence, it is easy to see that Hegel's philosophy had deep roots in a tradition of Christian discourse in which the stress is on God's Lordship of history and the double role providence plays in leading humanity towards its true end: reconciliation with God. In the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries, liberal Protestants among the Cambridge Platonists and so-called Anglican Apologists had recovered this tradition and communicated it to liberal Protestants among the Germans. The point of the tradition was not to sanction the idea of man as his own maker or to celebrate autonomous human freedom. Rather, and as might be expected of Christians, the aim of the tradition was to reconcile man with God by encouraging the former to aspire to "be like God" in the Platonic sense of the phrase, especially as it was articulated by the Cambridge Platonists. At several places, Dale seems to recognize this. He says, for example, that Hegel aimed at "maintain[ing] his immanent telotheology, wherein God and the world reach fulfillment with each other and within each other" (231). Or again: Hegel had "both an immanent and a transcendent view of God within history" (231). And yet, in keeping with the Aristotelian slant of his study, Dale sides with Aristotle against Plato's (and Hegel's) ontotheological solution for reconciling man with God.

As noted earlier, the opposition between Plato and Aristotle has long been a commonplace in the history of philosophy. Dale relies on the commonplace in conjunction with his "discovery" of Hegel's basic Aristotelianism to persuade readers of Hegel's immanentism. It would have been helpful, however, had he set his argument about Hegel and Aristotle in an interpretive framework that included discussion of how often in the history of philosophy (e.g., in pre-Christian Hellenistic Judaism, in Middle Platonism and in Arabic philosophy) as well as in the history of Christian theology (e.g., in Boethius, Thomism and neo-Thomism) Aristotle was read in the key of Platonism. I cannot go into detail about this here other than to refer readers to the work of Ernst Troeltsch, Werner Jaeger, A. E. Taylor, Etienne Gilson, A. H. Armstrong, and Alasdair MacIntyre all of whom recognize that Christians often interpreted Aristotle as providing ontoteleological arguments that prepared the way for transcendentalizing Platonic thinking about ascent to God. Indeed, these scholars show that "Christian Aristotelianism" was a prominent discourse in Christian theology and that it consisted in a "unique combination of the Platonic faith in transcendent spiritual being with a practical scientific . . . outlook on the world" (Armstrong). Dale needs to tell us why Hegel is not using Aristotle the way, say, Aquinas or Christian Platonists or liberal Protestants had often used him; namely, as an anthropocentric philosopher whose teleology of higher and higher human perfections opened terrestrial portals through which man could move as he re-spiritualizes himself and assimilates to God.

My final concern has to do with Dale's discussion of Hegel's concept of freedom. Three related issues demand attention. First, from Dale's account it would appear that Hegel held contradictory relative and absolute views of freedom at the same time. On the one hand, divine providence controls the process that results in the triumph of human freedom in history. As Dale says, for Hegel human beings achieve freedom when they act "freely and in accordance with the plan of divine providence" (184). On those terms, human freedom is not purely immanent, for the purpose of human life is still governed by God's providential plan or "economy of salvation," or what students of Plato's thought have called the "teleological view of divine providence." On the other hand, Dale holds that, for Hegel, "freedom means autonomy and self-direction" for human beings (184). According to Dale, these qualities are the defining features of what he calls "immanent teleology" (208). So whereas in the first case freedom is theocentric and religious, in the second case it is anthropocentric and secular. Fine; but when Dale says that Hegel has "an immanent and a transcendent" view of the role of God's providence in guiding human beings towards freedom in history (231), he surely (or inadvertently) raises a question about his Hegel contra Hegel thesis.

A similar confusion emerges in Dale's account of Hegel's geographical understanding of freedom's development over time as spirit moves from east to west. On the one hand, Dale emphasizes the political dynamic driving freedom westward (185f). As nations develop into states, and as certain states subsequently play key roles "on the world stage in the attainment of freedom" (185), human beings learn from experience both to co-operate with each other and to define self-interest in social and political terms. In this, Dale points out, that Hegel eventually identified freedom with the mature socio-political outlook that informed the emergence of civil society in Western Europe in the eighteenth century (176). Dale calls this "teleological communitarianism" and traces the origin of the idea to Aristotle (117).

On the other hand, one of the driving ideological forces behind the idea of freedom moving from east to west on the world's political landscape was the very old pre-Christian and Christian argument about the "transference of empires." For centuries Christians had used this argument as an ideological building block upon which they erected an argument about "the transference of religion" from east to west (e.g., from Jerusalem to Rome to Paris to Britain and America). Here Christianity in general and liberal Protestantism in particular register spirit's and freedom's progress in human history. And that is because in this tradition reconciliation of God and man is identified as humanity's ultimate destiny. Dale neglects to talk about this aspect of freedom's march westward -- that is to say, he is silent about the religious fact that Protestantism (but not orthodox Protestantism) saw itself as a religion of freedom that was on the verge of being realized in America.

A third problem that arises in Dale's account of Hegel's concept of freedom has to do with the "end of history" argument which he introduces while discussing the role of America in spirit's move from east to west. Since his primary focus is on changes on the political landscape upon which freedom moves, Dale does not hesitate to say that Hegel's philosophy of spirit "peters out," "loses its way" and becomes deeply "flawed" (197, 227, 198, 233) when he has to acknowledge the possibility of a wide open political future for people living in America. This is true, Dale contends, because that possibility gives the lie to the notion of history having achieved its end/completion/consummation in the emerging civil societies of Protestant Europe. His suggestion here is that, because Hegel "felt that the evolution of freedom still had possibilities which waited for it in a future yet to be decided" (227), he had to accept that the "end of history" he thought had been realized in Protestant Europe was less an end than a "new beginning" (222). He then conceptualizes Hegel's predicament by offering two distinctions: one in which he says the Aristotelian counter-trend in Hegel's thinking involves a movement "towards open-ended possibility [for human beings in history] and away from [Eurocentric] completeness" (5); and another which holds that Hegel's idea of "end" is just a series of relative moments of "culmination," each moment of which "is an end but not the end [of history]" (4-5, 222-24). His point: since "a culmination is not an end," the "future" must be allowed "to take care of itself" (i.e., history "must go on, and that this going on is the out-working of spirit in the realization of freedom" (224)).

But for liberal Protestants in Europe, America was not a new geographical marker in the development of political freedom. Rather, it was a place of religious destination to which divine providence had directed Columbus in order for oppressed Protestants to have a place to go to practice their religion in freedom. In America, they argued, the Reformation started by Luther and Calvin in the sixteenth century would be "completed." For that reason, liberals gave a geographical spin to the distinction between the "first" and "second" Reformations, the latter fulfilling in practice (and in a third age of salvation history) what the former had inaugurated on the stage of world history in terms of religious values and the destination of humanity. Indeed, it was in America that Protestantism as a religion of freedom was providentially destined to be completed. In that sense, it was a movement towards "completion," not "away" from it, that drew the attention of Hegel to America.

Allow me in conclusion to boil down my criticism of Dale's interpretation of Hegel to a single issue. As we have learned, Dale holds that once God enters into history and becomes active in it three things happen: the indwelling of God's spirit in man becomes naturalized, historicized and humanized; there is a displacement of religious values from a transcendental to a immanent frame of reference; and God's divine plan of salvation becomes swallowed up in the immanent and open-ended evolutionary processes of secular history. Dale expresses the implication of these three movements in two revealing statements: "Divinity becomes humanity within time and as finite reality, showing the infinitude of the human and finitude of the divine" (208); and "because Hegel gives divine providence an immanent, this-worldly quality, a final reckoning in his philosophy for the work of divine providence cannot be had outside of history itself" (232).

The operative premise here is that God's descent into the world is a one-way movement rather than a two-way one in which descent is preparatory to the ascent of man back to God. As a one-way movement, providential activity is immanentized as an open-ended historico-evolutionary process. Thus the one-way movement severs the connection between God and man and celebrates man as his own maker. However, in the two-way movement the point of providential activity is not to liberate man from God's control or replace a teleological conception of providence with immanent teleology. No, the point is to use a pedagogic providence to awaken man to his divine origin and educate him to his divine destiny or purpose or end. In doing this, providence plays to the indwelling spirit in man, which, in the two-way argument, is qualitatively different from his immanent nature. In a certain tradition of Christian theology -- starting, say, with Irenaeus -- it was understood that God became man in order for man eventually to become like God. There is, to be sure, evolution in the two-way movement as well as in the one-way movement. But in the former God remains in control of the immanent processes that serve as natural portals (i.e., secondary causes) through which man ascends back to his Maker. Because Hegel's philosophy of spirit is about man's ascent, not God's descent, it needs to viewed less in terms of "the reconciliation of God with history" (Dale's position (231, 210)) than in terms of the ontotheological reconciliation of man with God (Hegel's position).

With this, our review of Dale has come full circle, taking us back to the opposition between Plato and Aristotle and transcendental and immanent explanations of the world. As Dale argues, these oppositions inform his Hegel contra Hegel thesis. And, as I have observed, for that thesis to be persuasive Dale needs to show Hegel moving from a transcendental to an immanent world-view. There are brilliant examples in western intellectual history for how to do this. Werner Jaeger's book on Aristotle; Ernst Cassirer's work on Renaissance humanists; and M. H. Abrams' study of English and German romanticism all provide detailed analysis of where in various authors' texts the move from the transcendental to the immanent occurs. Dale does not do that. What he does instead is preserve in good standing what he calls his "Heideggerian membership card" (6) by reading Heidegger into Hegel and then using the former's critique of ontotheological thinking, including that of Aristotle himself, both to close off man's access to transcendental being and to open up the future to the creative power of immanent being. This is very helpful for understanding how a recent generation of scholars has come to see Hegel as an immanentist and an Aristotelian. But the trajectory of Hegel's thinking does not move in that direction, for his philosophy of spirit moves inexorably upward through a hierarchical series of teleological ends (or economies of perfection) that carry man towards spiritual maturity and the completion of being. In this scheme, man is not his own maker because as he moves higher in the scale of being he acquires spiritual dispositions that are neither immanent nor given by nature. Dale admits that he has "little sympathy for [Hegel's] ontotheological way" of thinking (231). To his credit, he fully understands what ontotheological thinking consists in. The problem is that his book dismisses it for the purpose of upholding key components of Heidegger's philosophy. That might be edifying for those who wish to "keep the conversation [about Hegel] going" in Richard Rorty's sense, but unless one thinks Hegel's philosophy of spirit hinders the on-going conversation about transcendence and immanence, I do not think that is the way to go.