Hegel's Concept of Life: Self-Consciousness, Freedom, Logic

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Karen Ng, Hegel's Concept of Life: Self-Consciousness, Freedom, Logic, Oxford University Press, 2020, 319pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190947613.

Reviewed by Gerad Gentry, Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin and Lewis University


Interest in Hegel's Idealism has surged over the past thirty years and shows no sign of slowing. It is increasingly commonplace to view Hegel's significance as more than mere esotericism in the history of philosophy and sociology. The interpretive camps defining this resurgence are multifarious, but one variation has gained particular traction. Broadly, this interpretive camp emphasizes the continuity (inherited and critical) of Hegel's system with the epistemic advances of Kant's critical idealism. Within this broad interpretive camp, and for the sake of this review, we can pick out two prominent paths. On the one hand stand works like Robert Pippin's Hegel of 1989 (including the less epistemologically-restricted variation of his 2019 Hegel), for whom Kant's original synthetic unity of apperception in the first Critique becomes a touchstone for post-Kantian idealism's response to the (perceived) internal failings of Kant's idealism. On the other hand stand accounts like Eckart Förster's Hegel of 2011, for whom Kant's third Critique and the intuitive understanding is of chief significance for the trajectory of Hegel's philosophy. Within this influential camp and between these paths, Karen Ng's book is one of the finest, offering an original defense between the two as a compelling third path. In this work, she offers a systematic defense of the concept of life as the ground of judgment and genome of Hegel's system.

Ng critiques Pippin's and Robert Brandom's first-path accounts as overly subjective forms of idealism. Specifically, she critiques their disproportionate emphasis on the theoretical and practical conditions of self-consciousness in a way that undermines central objective features, problematically giving rise to an account of the freedom of self-consciousness as "indifferent to the determinations of life." Their emphasis, while narrowly helpful, ultimately undermines the basis on which self-consciousness is not merely causally related to life, but normatively informed thereby. Whether or not this critique of the first path is entirely fair (considering Pippin's core account of the "life of concepts" in the significance of aesthetics for self-consciousness), it is clear that Ng's account reorients from the emphases of the first path to systematically prioritize Hegel's idea of life as an objective condition of the absolute method. Ng likewise differentiates herself from key figures of the second path, specifically Förster and Sally Sedgwick, arguing that their emphasis on an intuitive understanding is inadequate to ground Hegel's account of the reciprocity and speculative identity between subject and object. It is not clear to me that Ng's account is fundamentally distinct from the second path on this score (I'll return to this later on). Ng's interpretation is an important third, or at the least a significant modification of the second path; and while I think the direction of her account is exactly right, there are three worries that I will raise after the following overview of her argument. These worries, while substantial, do not negate the fact that it is one of the very best interpretations of Hegel's philosophy to date and supremely executed.


Ng's aim in this book stems from a twofold interest in Hegel's concept of life. On the one hand, she takes the concept of life to be constitutive of reason as a dynamic, "living activity in constant development" and thereby central to the entirety of Hegel's system (p. 3). On the other hand, she views it not merely as central but more strongly as one of the core grounds of Hegel's idealism (pp. 151, 291). Under this second articulation, Ng's aim is to show that the concept of life is a "necessary presupposition" of cognition (p. 256) and ground of Hegel's idealism "insofar as life provides the model for the realization of subjective aims and ends as something objective, manifesting, as Hegel claims, the form of a 'subject-object'" (p. 11). Ng's book can be understood as a defense of this two-fold thesis (my attribution). This twofold thesis, put succinctly, is this: The concept of life is simultaneously constitutive of what reason is and grounds a defining feature of Hegel's idealism: a specific kind of subject-object identity. As such, Ng suggests that the concept of life will turn out to be Hegel's greatest contribution to post-Kantian idealism (p. 10). According to Ng's Hegel, Idealism stands or falls depending on the integration of this concept. Ng aims to apply the concept of life to the three systematic issues of 1) self-consciousness, 2) freedom, and 3) logical form (each of which is reflected in the subtitle of the book).

Ng's strategy for defending the systematic significance of her twofold-thesis consists in three fundamental and "interrelated claims." These are:

(C1) the core tenets of Hegel's philosophy are defined by the "purposiveness theme" inherited from the Kant's a priori principle of purposiveness in the third Critique (p. 43). Ng takes Hegel to be inheriting what Kant calls inner purposiveness of natural ends from the teleological power of judgment and the principle grounding the validity of such judgements as a heuristic for cognition. Where Kant saw this objective principle of purposiveness as merely regulative, Hegel takes it as constitutive. Chapter 2 serves as Ng's defense of C1.

(C2) Hegel's "speculative identity thesis," inherited (partially) from Schelling, is the core of Hegel's philosophical method and identifies a fundamental relationship between life and self-consciousness. Put differently, this identity is a necessary "relation and opposition between self-consciousness and life" (p. 8), and a "relation in which opposition, separation, duplicity, and [diremption] remain ever present" (p. 74). This identity thesis lays claim to a dynamic, constitutive significance of life for self-consciousness. Chapter 3 serves as Ng's defense of C2 and proceeds through Hegel's Differenzschrift, Phenomenology, and Logic.

(C3) Reading the Subjective Logic as Hegel's "Critique of Judgment," what Hegel calls 'the original judgment of life' (6:473) "provides the key to understanding the Idea as the ground of Hegel's philosophical system, representing the full development of the positive and constitutive role of purposiveness in connection with the activities of self-conscious cognition" (p. 10). In light of such a reading it becomes evident that "life opens up the space of reasons" (pp. 234, 281). Chapters 4-8 serve as Ng's defense of C3. She begins this with an account of Hegel's immanent deduction of the concept in the Science of Logic (the final transition of the Doctrine of Essence to the Doctrine of the Concept). Identifying two influences on Hegel's deduction, namely Spinoza and Aristotle (pp. 132,141), Ng's Hegel arrives at a logic of actuality, an activity of form (Formtätigkeit), where activity is best understood as a Wechselwirkung or reciprocal determination (p. 127). This logic of reciprocal determination is in turn most fully recognizable as an internal purposiveness of the concept and reflects a constitutive alternative to Kant's idea of a natural end (Naturzweck) (p. 151).

From this imminent deduction of the concept (p. 160), Ng turns to the Doctrine of the Concept itself, with Chapters 5-8 corresponding to Hegel's divisions of the Doctrine of the Concept into Subjectivity, Objectivity, and the transition into the Idea. The interpretive thread running through these final chapters is that the Doctrine of the Concept should be read as Hegel's "critique of judgment," influenced partially by Hölderlin, wherein the concept of life serves as the formative (constitutive) structure (p. 168). Interestingly, Ng argues that the ground of judgment stems from the "original judgment of life" [das ursprüngliche Urteil des Lebens](p. 172). If initially this seems problematic, it becomes less so after Ng clarifies that she interprets "original judgement of life" as the "logical form of life" (p. 173). She justifies this interpretation by appeal to Hegel's account of the logical concept of life as original judgment. So, the logical form of life is the reciprocal ground of judgment.

Chapter 6 nicely traces Hegel's account of inner purposiveness as the adequate form of the self-determining activity emerging through the inadequacies of Mechanism, Chemism, and external purposiveness (p. 229). This inner purposiveness allows Hegel to simultaneously retain the distinction between self-conscious life and non-life while also necessitating the continuity between the two (again drawing on the speculative identity thesis) (pp. 234, 244).

Chapters 7 and 8 embody Ng's fuller defense of the interpretation of the logical idea of life as "original judgment," which grounds his system (p. 246). This "original judgment of life" is the culminating significance of the purposiveness theme of the book (p. 10). (Her account of the role of genus [Gattung] in judgment is particularly noteworthy.) In a key passage, Ng writes,

The positive contribution of a logical concept of life can thus be summed up as follows: life is logical cognition in the shape of immediacy, an immediate unity of Concept and objectivity that is the necessary presupposition of cognition in its self-conscious form. As the necessary presupposition of cognition, what life contributes is a determinacy or determinateness (Bestimmtheit) without which logic would be entirely empty (leer). (p. 256)

This defense consists chiefly in the view that the idea is necessarily "doubled", or internally, reciprocally self-determining between life and cognition (pp. 255, 277). This inner reciprocity is the self-determining activity characterizable as the absolute method (p. 244). This account of the Idea allows Ng to make sense of Hegel's rejection of two sources of knowledge (e.g., sensibility and understanding), in favor of a self-active, developmental form of self-consciousness that retains an internal distinction of immediacy and mediation as moments of its own method (pp. 249-255). Life and cognition replace intuition and concept (p. 253). The logical idea of life becomes a kind of a priori schema internal to the method whereby self-consciousness is active and actualizes itself (p. 277). From this, Ng argues, the absolute method is properly understood as a dialectic between life and cognition (p. 287). That method is the growth of the life activity of the forms of self-consciousness, and its ground is the logical concept of life itself.

The direction of Ng's interpretation (what I have termed the third-path view -- arising from the fact that it is generally compatible with the broader interpretive camp that includes the first and second paths) seems to me to be exactly right. To my mind, what distinguishes this vital third path, which encompasses others like Thomas Khurana, Dean Moyar, and myself, is fourfold: 1) a contextual emphasis not merely on the first or third Critique, but both as substantial sources of influence to the very method of Hegel's logic; 2) an emphasis on Hegel's Aristotelian roots, prominent in his Realphilosophie; 3) an emphasis on an organic form as more than mere analogy, but also central and constitutive of the absolute method; and 4) an emphasis on the Logic both as the necessary condition to the fuller system's status as a science proper (or genuine metaphysics), and also a de-prioritizing of the Logic as the most abstract and inadequate stage in a systematic account of the life of reason, which builds toward the absolute shapes of the life of self-consciousness. If something like these four, non-exhaustive features define what I've called the third path, then I take Ng's work to be the most comprehensive and finest example of the third path to date. Of course, greater compatibility between the second and third-path views is possible. For example, Ng's emphasis on the concept of life as the ground of judgement and judgment as the essential form of intelligibility (p.292) is perhaps overly restrictive (even when judgment is taken in its "broader sense" p.246). If the idea of life that concludes the Logic were identified instead as the condition of the possibility of intelligibility(not merely judgment, but also inclusive of non-judgment forms of self-conscious life), this might make both interpretive camps consonant. Regardless, Hegel's system and particularly the Science of Logic are notoriously challenging to interpret succinctly, comprehensively, and compellingly, yet Ng does this in exemplary form.

Three Concerns with Ng's Hegel

First: Kant's third Critique does not identify the a priori principle of purposiveness with a purposiveness of nature as Ng claims. Given its prominence, her interpretative claim here needs explanation. Kant speaks of a purposiveness of form (subjective) and a purposiveness of nature (objective), and yet a third: the a priori principle of purposiveness. Not once does he claim that the concept of a purposiveness of nature is the same as the a priori principle of purposiveness. If anything, he aligns the a priori principle more with the subjective power of judgment since its purpose is to ground the deduction of the validity of a judgment type. In Kant's 1787 letter to Reinhold he identifies his newly discovered third a priori principle, which would ground a "Critique of Taste" (10:515). Consistent with this stated intention, the only formal deduction(connected with the a priori principle of purposiveness) occurs in the Critique of the Aesthetic Power of Judgment and this deduction establishes the only constitutive (subjective) use of the power of judgment (5:279-90). Moreover, he says, "The principle of taste is the subjective principle of the power of judgment in general" (§35). He never identifies the "purposiveness of nature" as the a priori ground of the power of judgment as Ng claims (p. 47). Following from this, Ng claims that Kant's a priori principle of purposiveness does not ground constitutive judgments, but Kant is clear that it does in the subjective universal use (5:196); it is only in the objective use (nature) that it is merely regulative. (5:279-90). So, to interpret the purposiveness of nature, which has no deduction and which Kant never claims is the a priori principle governing the power of judgment in general as that a priori principle, needs explanation.

Kant does state in the first introduction that he will give a deduction for the teleological use (20:251); however, he clarifies that the teleological (regulative) validity will depend on the aesthetic deduction in both the first and second introductions (20:243) and in the text (5:346). There is no distinct a priori principle of purposiveness of nature, nor is there a deduction of teleological judgments. Teleological judgments of natural ends are judged as if they are works of art, with the difference that the formative (creative) power is ascribed to the object itself as internal to the organism and so the judgment must remain regulative.

Of course, it is possible that Hegel misread Kant, and that by "Kant's principle of purposiveness" he meant the "concept of a purposiveness of nature." Such an interpretive claim would likewise need further explanation and justification, and I think there is reason to believe Hegel read Kant correctly here and saw the actual a priori principle of purposiveness as the pre-schematic, logical transition to the idea of purposiveness of nature. But the logical concept of purposiveness as the final transition in Hegel's Logic is, I suggest, importantly distinct from an idea of purposiveness of nature. The idea of purposiveness of nature Hegel credits to Aristotle throughout the Realphilosophie and predictively in E §204. So, while I agree with the direction of Ng's argument and the ultimate conclusion, this interpretive choice is left unexplained.

Second: From the first, there immediately follows a larger question. If Hegel did indeed have in view Kant's purposiveness of natural ends (organisms), then why would Hegel credit this contribution as arising from Kant instead of Aristotle? As has become commonly recognized (including by Ng), Hegel credits this idea to Aristotle's conception of the soul (de Anime) throughout his Realphilosophie (e.g., E §245). Yet, as I've noted elsewhere, he omits reference to Aristotle at this key passage of the Logic introducing the "purposiveness theme" and only mentions Aristotle in E §204 when referencing the Idea that is established as a result of this final transition. Given Ng's interpretation, some further explanation for the Aristotle-omission is needed, particularly in light of the substantial space that Ng takes to explain the failure in Kant's regulative conception of purposiveness of nature (which didn't exist in Aristotle's). Why complicate the account at all by bringing in Kant (or Schelling ch. 3) if what we really have in view in the moments of the Logic preceding the Idea is an idea of inner purposiveness of organisms?

A further result of these assumptions is that Ng then falls into a common trap when interpreting Hegel's Logic (found also in Pippin's 1989 Hegel);namely, that of interpolating ideas of Realphilosophie into the moments of the Logic not as references, but as qualities of a given moment. Hegel is explicit that the Logic must remain presuppositionless and take only that which its previous moments internally necessitated. While Ng notes that Hegel is concerned about interpolation of Ideas from Realphilosophie into the Logic(p. 255), she does not maintain the same divide but instead moves freely (un-flagged) between logical concepts and ideas of Realphilosophie. Aristotle's soul and Kant's idea of a purposive natural end are examples of ideas of Realphilosophie that are only justified (according to Hegel) by the resulting Idea of the Logic. They can't precede it as moments of its proof. Importing such ideas into the final stage of the Logic undermines the basis on which these ideas gain their validity as the result. And if such a move is permissible, then surely Aristotle's concept of the soul could equally have served as the ground of judgement on Ng's view, or if it could not have, that too needs explaining. This second concern leads to my third.

Third: Concerning the fundamental method that will emerge in the Logic, Hegel writes,

Logic. . . cannot presuppose any of these forms of reflection, these rules and laws of thinking, for they are part of its content and they first have to be established within it . . . Logic, therefore, cannot say what is it is in advance, rather does this knowledge of itself only emerge as the final result and completion of its whole treatment. (WL 21.27)

Instead of showing this thoroughgoing inner necessity of the logical method from the beginning, Ng introduces key ideas (like Hegel's inheritance of purposiveness from Kant or an idea of life) as "insights" or "models." While Ng's analysis of these ideas and their role is exemplary and monumental, the side-effect of this approach is that Ng's 2020 Hegel is a systematic philosopher whose system depends on a set of "necessary presuppositions" (pp. 105f, 271; cf. pp. 277, 280).

The purpose of theLogicand Encyclopedic system was to show the absolute method and its own inner necessity, such that it could overcome key forms of skepticism (as Paul Franks has compellingly shown) and so serve as a completion to the critical philosophy begun by Kant. By reducing purposiveness to an insight taken from the Kantian teleological idea of a natural end (as cause and effect of itself) and applied as a "necessary presupposition" of cognition and for the relation of life and cognition in the absolute method, Ng undermines the true force of Hegel's achievement in the Idea, namely, its genuinely purposive strength as having arisen of necessity by the internal determinations of the method of the Logic which begins without presupposition and proceeds only according to that which is internally necessitated. That is, Ng's own account undermines the deeper purposiveness at work, which is necessarily prior to "the Idea" as its logical ground (constituting itself from the very outset of the logic) and by which it allows "the Idea" to "emerge as the final result and completion of its whole treatment."

While these concerns are substantial, it is also important to note that they fall within the context of what I take to be perhaps the best work on Hegel's Science of Logic and system to date. A work of this scale can only accomplish so much within the limits of the book. Moreover, these challenges, while avoidable, are not insurmountable. I don't know how committed Ng is to the core presuppositional features of her account. If Ng isn't committed to these "necessary presuppositions," then she could helpfully augment the account by offering a justification of these core presuppositions through appeal to further ground that is itself internally necessitated by presuppositionless method of Hegel's Logic. In any case, these challenges do not in the least detract from the book's status as a monumental achievement. Such worries notwithstanding, Ng's account is one of the greatest and most faithful articulations of Hegel's thought.

One of the most prodigious works on Hegel, Ng's is a book that will inform Hegel scholarship and scholarship in Idealism for decades to come. Perhaps more importantly, it augments an increasingly compelling basis for the rethinking and reframing of contemporary philosophical issues to capitalize on the dynamic insights of Hegel's thought, helping us to leave farther behind the hackneyed clichés of the formulaic Hegelianism that became commonplace outside Hegel studies. This book is a must for serious scholars on Hegel and for those interested in the philosopher who, more than most in the modern world, substantially influenced an unusual range of academic and sociopolitical movements. Ng's book is a masterpiece.