Hegel's Elements of the Philosophy of Right: A Critical Guide

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David James (ed.), Hegel's Elements of the Philosophy of Right: A Critical Guide, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 234 pp.,

Reviewed by William Desmond, Villanova University/KU Leuven


Hegel's Philosophy of Right is one of the great works of ethical and political philosophy – one which some put on a par with Plato's Republic, or see as exceeding Hobbes's Leviathan. It is said also that in the early twentieth century two schools of Hegelian philosophy faced each other: the right-Hegelians in the guise of the fascists, and the left-Hegelians in the guise of the Marxists and communists. There is something to this, but to imply that Hegel is to blame for both would be an indictment too far. Yet the contrast does precipitate thought. There is an unbroken line of continuity between Hegel and the young Hegelians, hence a line of inheritance from Marx, though the line is also one of coarsening the dialectic and its more finessed possibilities. In recent decades, there have been many efforts to take the sting out of the accusation that Hegel was an ideological canonizer of the Prussian state of his time, and a more sympathetically liberal Hegel has been offered for consideration, sometimes in a manner too amnesiac about the more extreme implications hidden in Hegel's way of thinking, implications sometimes drawn out into historical reality. Hegel has been reclaimed by the professors.

This book is such a work of reclamation. It contains ten chapters on Hegel's Elements of the Philosophy of Right, written by diverse hands, plus an editor's introduction, and presenting the reader with exposition and analysis of many of the main themes in Hegel's work. Hegel's Philosophy of Right is both a classic text and a seminal work of legal, social and political philosophy that has given rise to very different interpretations since its publication in 1821. The chapters in this volume reflect this diversity. They are written with the advantage of historical distance, and they seek to communicate a fresh perspective that makes readers aware of the breadth and depth of this classic work, as well as its continuing relevance.

In a helpful introduction, David James offers us a reflection on "Freedom and History in Hegel's Philosophy of Right." It is helpful in setting the scene in terms of the diverse contributions to follow, most of them coming across as a more or less "liberal" reading of Hegel, though not in any uncritical way. The book does not claim to be comprehensive, but reflects the interests of the contributors. As always in such cases, one worries that the commentator is ventriloquizing through Hegel, but, for the most part, this does not happen. This introduction itself concludes by stressing the challenge that the rationality of contemporary social and political arrangements pose for us, by contrast with Hegel's own wrestling with the rationality of his own time.

In "The Method of the Philosophy of Right," Frederick Neuhouser seeks to illuminate aspects of the distinctive method of Hegel's book. Neuhouser emphasizes how this work seeks to comprehend the modern social world and show it to be rational. He does not see the work as prescriptive of new institutions. Philosophical comprehension for Hegel entails seeing what is, and this as essential to the realization of freedom. What is essential for freedom, as Hegel understands it, is a comprehended reconciliation between the free individual and the social world in which individuals are participants. Hegel takes philosophical comprehension to be a matter of giving a rational form to a context already existing that implicitly has reason at work in it, though not always in a form that is properly understood by that given reality. Neuhouser rightly asks if the method of the Philosophy of Right requires prior understanding of other parts of Hegel's system. He gives attention to the movement in the Philosophy of Right as a development of the concept of practical freedom. All of this is not only a matter of conceptual analysis; we must address the question of institutional realization, and how conceptual analysis and institutional realization mesh together.

Stephen Houlgate offers a reflection entitled "Property, Use and Value in Hegel's Philosophy of Right." Houlgate's engaged and sympathetic way of interpreting Hegel is in evidence here. At the outset Hegel takes seriously the freedom of property. Property is made necessary by the very idea of freedom. Houlgate sets out to show why this is so. We are taken through some of the earlier parts of the Philosophy of Right on the relation of free will and (abstract) right, the connection of right and person. The right of the human will to take possession of everything, to brand it with itself, so to say, might have merited reflection. Houlgate first explains property itself, and then turns to the use of property, followed by discussions of value and contracts. He concludes with some illuminating comparative remarks on the differences between Hegel and Marx in terms of their understanding of value and property. Marx borrows much from Hegel, not least with respect to the workings of dialectic in history, but Houlgate holds that in his account of capitalism he shows himself to be a thinker of the understanding (Verstand), and not dialectical reason (Vernunft).

Alan Wood offers an account of "Hegel on Morality." He addresses what he takes to be a commonplace in relation to Hegel, namely, his distinction of Moralität and Sittlichkeit, taking his engagement with the former to embody his critique of Kant and Fichte as offering an essentially individualistic morality. Hegel himself offers a more community-based way of thinking. The latter is sometimes taken to copper-fasten Hegel as a conservative thinker who only defers to customary social morality. He is an enemy of individualism. There is enough truth in this contrast to make it not wrong, but not enough  to make it right. The rich complexity of Hegel's thought defies every easy "either/or" between the individual and community. Wood comes to Hegel's aid in dispelling some of these (to him) simplifications, indeed caricatures. He offers a judicious exposition of the Philosophy of Right, and also makes good use of the treatments of morality and ethical life in the Phenomenology of Spirit. Among the relevant themes discussed is the relation of conscience and evil in the Philosophy of Right, one of the important discussions of evil in Hegel's corpus. I did note that the role of religion is not addressed in this contribution. Hegel does bring in religion in the later discussion of Sittlichkeit in the Philosophy of Right, and in the Phenomenology ethical life is not possible to understand without addressing the religious life of a people or epoch. One thinks too of Hegel's extensive discussion of evil in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Religion names a formation of Geist beyond morality.

Dean Moyar contrasts Hegel and Rawls under the title "Hegelian Conscience as Reflective Equilibrium and the Organic Justification of 'Sittlichkeit'." He wants to link Hegel's concept of conscience with Rawls' account of reflective equilibrium. The reason for this is the holism of Hegel's view of conscience, which contains the movement back and forth between universal principle and individual judgement that is central to reflective equilibrium. Hegel's movement from morality to ethical life, with the communal and institutional character of the latter, brings with it a widening of the field of relevant considerations. Moyar is interested in understanding what Hegel considers insufficient about Rawls' reflective orientation. He offers the suggestion that the issue hinges on the fact that Hegel is oriented to action rather than judgment. An action-based organicism is superior because it includes a public process of "feedback" that offers support for a dynamic, self-correcting model of political justification. Illuminatingly taking the reader outside a purely Hegelian context, Moyar shows Hegel's continued dialogical relevance with reference to one of the most discussed of contemporary political philosophers.

Hegel's now controversial views of the family and women are addressed by Kimberly Hutchings' "Living the Contradictions: Wives, Husbands and Children in Hegel's Philosophy of Right." She argues that for Hegel the relation of family to civil society and the state is not a linear or hierarchical relation. The family is not subsumed into civil society; nor are the tensions and contradiction between family and civil society resolved by the state. Hegel is aware how the modern market and state are sustained by personal relations, but no less is he aware of fault lines that threaten the stability of the state. There is more at stake than a functional account of how the family serves the higher purposes of the state. Hutchings' exposition of Hegel's views of the modern family is lucid and stresses the novelty of his view as well as the fact that it foregrounds the importance of the family in accord with its transformed religious status in modern Protestantism. Hutchins also claim to expose contradictions that raise questions about Hegel that, in turn, suggest an orientation beyond Hegel.

In "The Ethicality in Civil Society': Bifurcation, 'Bildung' and Hegel's Supersession of the Aporias of Social Modernity," Andrew Buchwalter takes up the normative status that Hegel assigns to civil society. He does so in light of the fact that civil society is also gripped by a host of pathologies: alienating working conditions, conspicuous consumption, the emergence and persistence of an underclass, the ravages of colonialism, and extraordinary disparities in wealth between rich and poor. What he claims for his approach is that Hegel fashions his account, not despite these pathologies and disparities but because of them. There are aporias of modern civil society that are indeed generated by dialectical stresses inherent in the social and political situation; but, as in Hegel's dialectical philosophy generally, the hand that inflicts the wound is also the hand that heals it. The unfolding of the social substance becomes a subject to itself, but the logic governing this becoming is immanent in the manner in which a community constitutes itself by addressing its own inherent maladies. Buchwalter gives special attention to the Bildung and the Bildungsprozess that are immanent in the full unfolding of the Philosophy of Right. There is a rejection of an understanding of ethical life as appealing to any pre-existing set of values or a given order of being. If there is a transcendence of the aporias of modern society it is an entirely immanent one. Of course, immanence alone may be the hand that wounds and only equivocally the hand that heals.

Hans-Christoph Schmidt am Busch considers "Why Ethical Life is Fragile: Rights, Markets and States in Hegel's Philosophy of Right." Given Hegel's desire to show citizens the way to identify with the polity, gaining thereby freedom and reconciliation, Schmidt am Busch takes cognizance of the fact that many deny the success of Hegel on this front, not least the Left-Hegelians and Marxists who claimed to be his inheritors, as well as proponents of contemporary critical theory. He does not think their critique is entirely justified and sets out to show a more nuanced Hegel, one who is aware of the ethical ambivalence of civil society, and of the limits of the state to counter some of the negative outcomes of civil society. This is why he wants to show Hegel as a theoretician of the fragility of modern ethical life. Indeed, he wants to argue that ethical life in the modern world, even if Hegel does not always say so explicitly, is marked by a fragility that is irrevocable.

Frank Ruda continues the exploration of related themes in "That Which Makes Itself: Hegel, Rabble and Consequences." Again, we find Hegel confronting the immanent contradictions of modern society and not shying away from the manner in which modern society necessarily generates poverty with a distinctive character. While pre-Reformation Christianity put poverty at the level of one of the evangelical calls, after Luther it is said to be more ethical to live from the value of one's labor, so that poverty loses any ethical value. All ought to earn their living by the work of their own hands, and thus avoid poverty. And yet modern civil society produces a poverty where all the advantages of civil society are lost while the desires it produced persist. Under the term "rabble" refers to the most extreme form of this difficulty. Ruda distinguishes interestingly between rabble in a more generic sense, and a second kind of rabble which he calls "luxury rabble." Luxury generate not only the ordinary sense of rabble but also a kind of rabble in the midst of affluence itself. A number of interesting discussions here perhaps reflect current forms of society more than the form of society in Hegel's day. Though I worry about ventriloquizing, this is interesting ventriloquizing.

David James gives attention to the logic of the will, noting Hegel's own references, sometimes in the form of asides, to his larger Logic, and its bearing on the Philosophy of Right. This chapter is entitled "Practical Necessity and the 'Logic' of Civil Society" and it tries the most explicitly of all the chapters to pay respect to this aspect of Hegel's book. It does so by putting the primary stress on practical necessity rather than logical necessity, offering us an account of the transition from civil society to the state as best explained in terms of this practical necessity. James agrees that this approach does not account for all the features of Hegel's thought. One thinks of this proposal as tilting towards a certain Kantian distinguishing of theoretical and practical reason rather than the Hegelian affirmation that both theory and practice are manifestations of reason, and hence subject to the same logic.

Ludwig Siep asks the question: "How Modern is the Hegelian State?" Hegel himself and his admirers take pride in the claim to be modern. Even when not granted the fullness of the claim, Hegel is seen, by Habermas for instance, as the first philosopher for whom modernity became a problem. Against the image of him as a reactionary conservative, many Anglophone philosophers have increasingly wanted to see him as a prominent thinker of modernity. The recognized affinity with pragmatism and Wittgenstein-influenced styles of thought, for instance, have dealt a blow to the image of Hegel as the a priori metaphysician who conceptualizes reality as a whole, according to a procrustean logic into which everything finally is to be fit in. Siep asks about the distinctive sense in which Hegel is a philosopher of modernity, drawing on how Hegel himself saw modernity. Like many of the contributors, he focuses on the features of civil society and the state that mark modernity. He wants to bring Hegel's conception of modernity into conversation with concepts of modernity prevalent now. He does not deny that there are features that cannot be called modern, and he rightly reminds us of Hegel's appeal to antiquity. For him, the sovereignty of the state is in decisive respects too powerful, while the individual's right of political participation is too weak. He finds this to be so, not only with respect to today's perspectives, but also with respect to philosophers closer to Hegel's own time. By contrast with Kant, for instance, Hegel is more modern relative to the welfare state, whereas his views of war and international law are less modern. We should see the relevance of Hegel to current conditions, but not underestimate the gap separating our time from his.

All the contributions are worthy of commendation for their engagement with Hegel and his concerns. As the summaries above communicate, there is much to be learned from them. I would have liked if the prevailing stress on self-determination addressed more fully issues concerned with an ethics of the other wherein a logic of autonomy or self-determination is not enough. The "free will that wills the free will" is not a subtle enough formulation of right for an ethics differently attuned to the other as other, and our "being free" or "being freed" in relation to the other. I would also have appreciated some more attention to the place of religion, and the relations between morality, ethical life and religion. Finally, with the exception of the last chapter, there is no consideration of the concluding part of the Philosophy of Right, which deals with World-history. This is surely one of the most fascinating and challenging parts of the entire work. The only contribution that touches on world history is Siep's concluding chapter,touching indirectly in dealing with diverse definitions of the "modern," definitions for which questions of world-history are not lacking in relevance. Here there would have been an opportunity for asking about the relation of the political and the trans-political, as well as the problematic status of the agency of objective Geist, wavering as it does between the human and the divine. Hegel would deny the wavering, and say that there is a dialectical interplay between the two, but this is just the issue at stake, even in the immanent unfolding of morality, ethical life, civil society, the state and world-history. The philosophy of world-history is not fashionable now, but we are dealing with Hegel's continuing challenge after all, and philosophy here may ask us not to take as the last word Hegel's dictum that philosophy is its own time comprehended in thought. And perhaps, to add a further twist, philosophy is not just our own time comprehended in thought.