Hegel's Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Politics

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Michael J. Thompson (ed.), Hegel's Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Politics, Routledge, 2018, 333pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138288515.

Reviewed by  Dean Moyar, Johns Hopkins University


One of the tasks of those working on the history of political philosophy is to connect the writings of the past to the problems and theories of the present. This is naturally thought of as step two in a process, the first step of which is to understand the original text on its own terms. Only once we have the interpretation right will we be in a position to say how the claims in the historical text -- specified in step one -- relate to today's issues. Seems pretty simple. But in the case of Hegel several factors complicate this process. Hegel's main work of political philosophy, known by its abbreviated title as the Philosophy of Right, is explicitly based on the logic that Hegel lays out in his Science of Logic and Encyclopedia. That logical project is extremely difficult to comprehend in itself, let alone to connect to the political philosophy. By contrast, there is a great deal of provocative material in the Philosophy of Right that is intelligible without reference to the logic. Writers on the political philosophy thus confront a choice: delve into the logical underpinnings of the Philosophy of Right and the details of the logic, or remain at the practical level of norms of action and familiar topics of punishment, moral imputation, social institutions, etc. Those who take the latter option seem to depart from the simple two step process, for they seem to connect Hegel to the present before understanding fully what he is saying. Yet the alternative, logic-centered reading risks rendering Hegel's political philosophy available only for the tenacious few who are willing to engage deeply with the logical project.

Advocating this second alternative, the volume under review is premised on the idea that too much recent writing on the political philosophy neglects the metaphysical-logical underpinnings of the theory. It joins another recent volume, Hegel's Political Philosophy,[1] in redirecting our focus to Hegel's logic as the basis of the Philosophy of Right. The corrective is welcome in principle, but as a polemical approach it can make for uncharitable and therefore unproductive reading. Sometimes this means taking an author's single incautious pronouncement to stand for the whole approach.[2] Sometimes it means spinning an author's claims in a direction that the author would not recognize. Sometimes it takes the form of a general charge that anyone who does not buy into Hegel's full metaphysical picture must be a defender of neoliberal market individualism. In this volume, even those who focus on mutual recognition are taken to task for remaining too close to the liberal individualist picture. The claim is that only an account of the metaphysics underlying such recognition could be adequate to the challenge of overcoming the contractualist framework that dominates modern politics.

A major difficulty with carrying out the book's agenda is that even after thirty years of lively debate over the metaphysical character of Hegel's philosophy there is nothing like a consensus on what Hegel's metaphysics amounts to. The lack of consensus on the logic sets up a daunting dual task for the contributors -- both to give an interpretation of the metaphysics and to say how that connects to Hegel's political philosophy in a way productive for today. Some of the authors in this collection align themselves with strong metaphysical readers against the view of Robert Pippin and others that Hegel should be read as a post-Kantian, critical metaphysician. They think that Pippin's reading goes hand in hand with a non-metaphysical view of the political philosophy. But that criticism is not shared by everyone in this collection. Indeed, the volume contains many different takes on what Hegel's logic is, ranging from more traditional metaphysical readings to novel perspectival and action-oriented readings that make the logic itself a kind of praxis.

The latter kind of reading, as I note below in my summary of the contributions, undercuts the opposition between the metaphysical and practical approaches to the Philosophy of Right, thereby calling into question the premise of the volume as a whole. The volume also has some of the familiar shortcomings of collections on Hegel: not enough female contributors, too much sketching of the big picture at the expense of argumentative details, too much rehashing of old debates. But this is a volume worth reading. I would not go so far as to say that this book succeeds in spite of the polemical agenda announced in the introduction, but I do think that the departures from that agenda are more rewarding than those essays that hew closely to it. While all the authors engage to some extent with the logical underpinnings of the theory, most set their own agenda and do so in a way that made me look at Hegel's texts in a new way.

Peter J. Steinberger's "The Course of God: Reading Hegel" focuses on the key but elusive conception of Geist. Through an extended analogy with mathematics Steinberger draws out the multiple meanings of Geist as the content of thought (both in the sense of all possible content and in the sense of the content that is authoritative at a specific point in history), as a social institution that is "rationality itself," and as "an individual way of life." (19) On the specific issue of metaphysics, Steinberger acknowledges that Hegel's account is "deeply Kantian," even claiming that "Absolute Geist . . . rules out any consideration -- any intelligible thought about -- a world beyond human experience . . ." (25) On the other hand, there are echoes of Charles Taylor's theory of cosmic spirit that is supposed to place the process of the world beyond us:

In our very capacity for free and rational thought, each of us participates necessarily in a larger, cosmic process that is in the deepest sense rational, inexorable and absolute, and that involves, as one of its constitutive elements, the development and maintenance of an organic, well-ordered and internally differentiated polity. (30)

In "The Metaphysic of Spirit and Hegel's Philosophy of Politics" Andrew Buchwalter also focuses on Geist, which he reads primarily "as the conjunction of substance and subjectivity." (33) The idea of "internal self-reflexivity" (33) is the hallmark of Buchwalter's approach. He contrasts his view of Hegel on action with Pippin's expressivist reading, arguing that "the principle of inwardization" (37) is more fundamental than expression. This is surprising since Pippin places Kantian apperception, i.e., self-reflexivity, at the heart of his interpretation of both the theoretical and practical philosophy. I worry that Buchwalter's opposition between reflexivity and expression threatens to conceal what is distinctive about Hegel's view. Buchwalter rightly emphasizes the role of conscience, but it remains unclear how conscience "reaffirms the role of a metaphysics of spirit in Hegel's account of practical philosophy." (39) It is just not obvious that "reflective endorsement" (40) and "individual autonomy" (40) need to have anything to do with metaphysics in a robust sense that can be contrasted with appeals to ordinary human reasoning.

Angelica Nuzzo's "Speculative Logic as Practical Philosophy: Political Life in Times of Crisis" might seem to bring the collection's project to a crisis. For she reads the logic itself as fundamentally practical, a "logic of action" (59) or "transformative processes" (59). If she is right, then it is not clear how much an appeal to the metaphysics (which is the logic) diverges from appeals to various categories of action that typically figure in accounts of political philosophy. Nuzzo herself employs this interpretation of the logic in order "to think of politics in times of historical crisis." (65) She brings together Hegel's dialectical method with a consideration of Antonio Gramsci's conception of the interregnum and Thucydides' stasis to understand how we can advance beyond the moment of crisis.

Eric Goodfield does not present his own version of the politics-metaphysics connection (which he has developed in a previous monograph), but instead offers a survey of the historical trends that he thinks have led commentators astray. He traces skepticism towards Hegel's system from Leonard Trelawney Hobhouse to Karl Popper, and then outlines a related skepticism towards the metaphysics in the 1950s from Hegel's supposed friends such as Walter Kaufmann and J.N. Findlay. The latter are said "to truncate his corpus and system of thought, at times frenetically, in order to prune an understanding that could contend and withstand the twin pressures of liberalism and positivism that had already weighed down so heavily upon Hegel's legacy." (87) Briefly surveying the work of Taylor, Shlomo Avineri, Allen Wood, Michael Hardimon and Fredrick Neuhouser, among others, Goodfield argues that recent commentary has abandoned Hegel's self-understanding, and his resources for political thought, by making him conform to our liberal presuppositions. This is a helpful survey, but Goodfield criticizes with too broad a brush. It seems wrong to me to say that all this work has "dispensed with the issue of justifiable and intelligible foundations" (93), as if all these authors were barely concealed positivists enlisting Hegel in a liberal project that bypasses his most important ideas.

Michael J. Thompson's own essay is the most sustained attempt to provide a reading of the politics through the metaphysics, an account of what he calls the "metaphysical infrastructure to our normative concepts." (102) He holds that Hegel's project provides "a content to what is merely formal and lays the groundwork for a kind of practical reason with deep roots of meaning that grasp objective dimensions of our lives and are not simply constructed by our agreements and endorsed by our reflection." (106) Thompson claims that "Hegel is after a much richer account of our sociality" (108) than the social-recognitive accounts of Terry Pinkard and Pippin can provide. I have a hard time seeing how the many formulations of the constitutive ontological process actually depart in any fundamental way from the projects that Pinkard and Pippin have been pursuing. It seems rather mostly a shift in emphasis and an insistence that we can know that we are right in identifying the logical structures and that we are therefore entitled to relabel them as metaphysical or ontological. When I try to parse sentences such as the following, the result does not seem much different than views that focus on agents rather than ontology: "By ontological I mean a special way of reasoning about social reality in which Being can progress into more rational phases of existence according to its ability to manifest the structure of its concept." (110) Thompson thinks that this way of putting things gives us more resources for critique, since it establishes the truth behind practice. But the concept at issue in the Philosophy of Right is the concept of the free will, and the political is a domain of the realization of freedom. "Being" is a function of this freedom, and thus it cannot be an independent standard for what the free will has to will.

Sebastian Stein's excellent essay approaches the issue of metaphysics and politics through the debate over the sense in which Hegel's metaphysics is post-Kantian. For the central issue of the volume the key point made by Stein is that Hegel holds individuality to be irreducible. For Hegel, "concrete, particular courses of action committed by irreducible individuals are reason-generating and normatively binding in virtue of their identity with universality." (152) Stein argues persuasively that this strain in Hegel's metaphysics of the person makes it impossible to assimilate Hegel to an Aristotelian substantialist metaphysics. Though Stein does not press this point, it is not hard to see that this view of Hegel's metaphysics (and its centrality to the politics) supports reading him as an essentially liberal thinker invested in the centrality of individual choice to modern political life.

In "Against the Post-Kantian Interpretation of Hegel: A Study in Proto-Marxist Metaphysics," Michael Morris aims to revive a more metaphysical, pre-Kantian Hegel in the service of a political program inspired by Lukacs' Marxist reading. Morris holds that the post-Kantian program derives from Sellars' split between the realm of causality and the space of reasons, and he argues that all the readings of Hegel that draw on Sellars are unfaithful to Hegel because they accept a fundamental distinction between empirical description and the space of reasons. (181) On the metaphysical side he stresses the Aristotelian dimension of Hegel's thought, in particular the role of teleology or final purposes. Leaving aside the accuracy of Morris' criticism of Sellars, it is worth noting that the teleological dimension he stresses is now firmly part of the post-Kantian interpretation, most notably in the work of Pinkard and Pippin over the past decade. Pinkard's Hegel's Naturalism is a study of the teleology at the heart of Hegel's thought as a whole, and Pippin's recent work on the logic has likewise stressed the teleological. While Morris details the importance of the social dimension in the post-Kantian project, he thinks that there is a better Marxist way to take sociality and history as fundamental. I confess that I could not tell how this version of Hegel, for whom "process or action" is "ontologically and epistemically basic" (196), departs dramatically from the post-Kantian Hegel. Everyone agrees that Hegel is not a subjective idealist, so the argument amounts to uncharitably foisting a subject-object dualism onto post-Kantian readings and then pointing to the many obvious ways in which that cannot be Hegel's view.

Kevin Thompson ("Objective Spirit: Hegel's Normative Social Ontology") wisely focuses on methodological issues, or the question of Hegel's systematicity. Thompson aims to overcome the dominant reading of objective spirit, which he calls "representationalist." This is a somewhat odd label, given that the critique of representationalism typically comes from Sellarsians such as Robert Brandom who aim to replace that epistemological view with a systematic inferentialist account. For Thompson the term refers instead to a view of objective spirit that takes it to be simply the customary norms of a given society rather than a more rationally articulated logical structure. I am not sure that he can make this charge stick against any major interpreters of Hegel, but Thompson does go on to provide a sound original interpretation of Hegel's own view. He labels Hegel's theory of ascending normative levels "the Axiom of the Hierarchy of Right," and he presents "the Master Argument of the Science of Right" as the logic of the book's major transitions. The term "ontology," though it appears in the title, does little to no work in the interpretation, which shows again the strain in thinking that such terms are central to the project of the Philosophy of Right.

Christopher Yeomans' strikingly original "Family Structures as Fields of Historical Tension: A Case Study in the Relation of Metaphysics and Politics" presents a reading of Kant, Fichte and Hegel on the family. I cannot summarize Yeomans' provocative engagement with history here. His main innovation on the side of metaphysics is his claim that the three moments of the Hegelian concept -- universality, particularity, and individuality -- should be read as three "perspectives from which any item can be viewed." (228) The three moments form "the basic taxonomy of takes on objects" (242), which Yeomans also labels "A Metaphysics of Interlocking Perspectives." (242) This unusual metaphysics, which to some may not seem like a metaphysics at all, comes from Hegel's "Subjective Logic." Yeomans uses it both to reconstruct Hegel's view of the family and to show how that view fails on Hegel's own terms.

In "Hegel's Metaphysics of Marriage: Teleology, Ontology and Sexually Embodied Freedom in the Philosophy of Right's Account of the Family," Joshua D. Goldstein fruitfully contrasts two models of the family in Hegel's account. What he calls the teleological dimension is "an unreconstructed Aristotelian" (255) view that leans on sexual differentiation and immediacy of feeling. Goldstein aligns this aspect of Hegel's view with the conception of the premodern family that anchors Greek ethical life. The "parallel metaphysics of the family" (262) is based on "the ontology of freedom" (262), which Goldstein identifies with Hegel's claim that marriage consists of a consciousness of the family's end that supersedes the teleological conception of the family. Much weight is put here on "the ontological habit of rightfully ethical love" (264), and though this use of "ontological" to modify "habit" was hard for me to bring into focus, Goldstein does open up new interpretive space.

David Kolb defends a Hegelian view of modern ethical life in his lively "Tiger Stripes and Embodied Systems: Hegel on Markets and Models." He sets up his account with a comparison of the contemporary European project (which he thinks Hegel would largely approve) to the neoliberal framework dominant in the US (which Hegel would of course despise). He thinks that Hegel's theory of freedom, and his logic of the concept, remain important resources for resisting the market logic of neoliberalism. His reading of the Logic gives an important place to "absolutely contingent factual details" (295), to the particularizing element that, though "messy and empirical" (295), is essential to Hegel's story. Kolb sticks to the language of "logic" rather than metaphysics, and his essay thus highlights again the question of what is added in stressing the metaphysical over the logical, normative, justificatory, etc.

Matthew J. Smetona's "Hegel and the End of a Particular Historical Development" revisits the debate over whether Hegel endorses the thesis that history comes to an end with bourgeois modernity. After reviewing the criticism of Alexandre Kojeve's famous reading of the Phenomenology, Smetona outlines the role of the logic and Hegel's "absolute method" to show that Hegel does not support any claim of a final historical endpoint. Smetona endorses Pippin's Kantian reading of the logic as "the conceptual conditions of possibility for any object of cognition to be an object at all" (310). Smetona thinks that the most valuable aspect of Hegel's logic is the method and its resources for criticizing civil society. He highlights the irrationality of the market and the possibility of overcoming it in "the infinite movement of thought in opposition to itself." (315) He bends Hegel in a Marxist direction by reading the contradictoriness of capitalist society into the Philosophy of Right, going so far as to say that Hegel's text "can be interpreted as a critique of all actually existing capitalist states." (318) This is a fitting end to the volume, for it brings out the sense in which the appeal to Hegel's metaphysics, or to a logic that reveals underlying truths of economic and political reality, is the expression of a wish that there was a real alternative to the liberal capitalist order.

One notable absence from the book is any detailed discussion of Hegel's actual theory of the state. This is surprising because the state is not only the official site of the political process, but also a prominent (and much debated) place where Hegel brings his logic directly to bear on structuring and justifying the political. The absence of a discussion of the state goes together with the absence of any treatment of the inference (or syllogism), the main structuring device for the account of the state. The inference is the key to Hegel's conception of a rational totality, and Hegel uses it in an important passage (found in both versions of the logic) in which he writes of the state as a system of three inferences. I suspect that the state is missing because there is a lack of enthusiasm for Hegel's hereditary monarch, his critique of democracy, etc. This volume (like many before it) does in the end tend to promote Hegel rather than simply to analyze texts, which is not in itself so objectionable for a work on political philosophy, though it does stand in some tension with the criticism of other philosophers for being too selective in their readings. This dynamic shows that there is no clean two-step process of comprehension and application. Every author must select areas of focus, and those choices will be (and should be) informed by the needs of today.

For all the bluster of Hegel's criticism of social contract theory, individual freedom remains essential to his picture of modern life. Even with the logical underpinnings front and center, Hegel's political theory is not a full-fledged alternative to liberalism. Any politics rooted in metaphysics still has to answer to the ordinary self-understanding of formally free individuals. Hegel did indeed think that philosophy should not pander to common sense, so there can be no final overcoming of the tension between his technical philosophical apparatus and his appeals to intuition. This volume is a welcome reminder that there are underutilized theoretical resources in Hegel for thinking through the hopes and disappointments of modern politics.

[1] Brooks, T. and Stein, S., editors (2017). Hegel's Political Philosophy: On the Normative Significance of Method and System. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[2] Allen Wood's opening of Hegel's Ethical Thought is the leading example of a pronouncement that has led others to overlook the complexities of the overall interpretation. Wood responds to the charge of non-systematicity in his "Method and System in Hegel's Philosophy of Right," in Brooks and Stein (2017), 82-102.