Hegel's Political Philosophy: On the Normative Significance of Method and System

Placeholder book cover

Thom Brooks and Sebastian Stein (eds.), Hegel's Political Philosophy: On the Normative Significance of Method and System, Oxford University Press, 2017, 282pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780198778165.

Reviewed by Timothy L. Brownlee, Xavier University


This volume collects thirteen essays that address the question: to what extent does Hegel's political philosophy, especially his Philosophy of Right (PR), depend on the other elements of his philosophical system, and on his dialectical and speculative method? Some of the most significant English-language studies of PR to appear in the past thirty years have worked to challenge the claim that Hegel's practical philosophy depends essentially on his broader philosophical system, in particular on his logic. The contributors include some of the most prominent contemporary scholars writing on Hegel's practical philosophy, and, with some notable exceptions, they tend to defend the importance of method and system for understanding Hegel's political philosophy (though questions about systematic connections loom much larger here than those about Hegel's method). On the whole, the essays are high quality, and some may prove to have lasting influence on scholarship. At worst, the volume suffers from what I believe to be a few missed opportunities to engage with some important recent trends in Hegel studies (more below). At the very least, it includes important reading for students of Hegel's practical philosophy and scholars of German idealism. Some of its contributions are really excellent, breaking new ground in what is by now well-worn territory.

A helpful introduction by Brooks and Stein provides a succinct overview of the individual pieces. As they make clear, among their primary motivations was to consider the viability of interpretive approaches like those of Allen Wood and Frederick Neuhouser. Wood and Neuhouser are both interested in demonstrating the continuing significance of Hegel's ethics and social and political philosophy, a significance that is, they contend, undiminished by the fate of his logic and his broader system. It is clear that Brooks and Stein believe that much is lost in taking this approach, stressing that Hegel intended for his philosophy of right to be understood in relation to the rest of his system. (2-3) (Brooks is among the most vocal contemporary defenders of the systematic approach.)

In his contribution, Wood clarifies what he takes to be at issue in raising the questions of system and method. Bristling at the accusation that he endorses an anti-systematic or anti-methodological reading of Hegel, he argues that we need to distinguish between what is necessary to understand the thought of a historical figure, and what is necessary to appropriate that thought. Since Hegel is a systematic thinker who depends on a specific dialectical method, Wood dismisses the suggestion that he thinks we can understand PR without acknowledging its place in relation to the rest of Hegel's thinking, or its distinctive method, and he works to provide evidence that his earlier Hegel's Ethical Thought acknowledges this need. At the same time, he argues that the task of appropriating Hegel's practical philosophy does not depend on our seeing that philosophy as essentially "grounded in (and hence sharing the same fate as) his now clearly outdated speculative-logical system." (86) Wood claims that, since his interest in his earlier book was to make Hegel's ideas accessible to a broader, non-Hegelian audience, he devoted special attention to arguing that Hegel's insights in that work need not stand or fall with his logic. In his chapter here, he shows the continuing importance of elements not only of PR, but also of the logic, arguing that the latter articulates a "hierarchical version of conceptual pluralism" (97) that provides a corrective to the reductive "totalizing naturalis[m]" that Wood believes we find among certain contemporary philosophers and scientists. (95)

Even if no contributors explicitly address Hegel's texts in terms of Wood's distinction between understanding and appropriation, the majority explicitly defend some version of the systematic and methodological approach, and they seem, by and large, to focus primarily on the question of what is necessary to understand Hegel's thought. In an admirably clear essay, Kevin Thompson defends a robust systematic and metaphysical reading of PR, anchored primarily in Hegel's own introductory remarks to the work. He argues that Hegel's systematic commitments are oriented toward addressing a skeptical worry about the justification of normative claims that cannot be appropriately addressed from the standpoints of rationalism or empiricism.

We might expect other systematic accounts, those that interpret PR in light of the conclusions of the logic, to be similarly motivated by the drive toward internal consistency. Klaus Vieweg offers an account of the institutions of the state in light of Hegel's treatment of the syllogism in the logic. He argues that an appropriate understanding of the relation between these discussions provides the key for unlocking an implicit criticism of the institution of the monarchy, suggesting the primacy of the constitution and legislative assembly over the monarch. Working to make sense of Hegel's appeals to the historically-situated character of many of his central claims, Sebastian Stein appeals to the logic to articulate a distinction between always true philosophical knowledge -- knowledge from "the eternal standpoint of the concept as self-thinking, absolute Geist, i.e. of true, unconditioned thought that thinks itself as it truly is" (166-167) -- and possibly conditioned philosophical knowledge -- knowledge from the standpoint of "the particular, finite, empirically informed thinker" that is "potentially conditioned by truth-external elements in the attempt to think philosophical truth." (169) On Stein's account, we can appeal to the notion of philosophical knowledge to demonstrate that some of Hegel's own remarks in PR (he mentions, among others, those concerning the monarchy, the family, corporations, the inevitability of poverty and decadence [175]) themselves turn out merely to be instances of possibly conditioned philosophical knowledge, admitting correction by us, on the grounds that those corrections provide a more adequate expression of Geist as it truly is. Vieweg and Stein therefore present a sort of mirror image of Wood's own appropriative revisionism. In place of rejecting the conclusions of the logic to preserve some insights and arguments in the practical philosophy, they argue that we should revise PR in light of the claims of the logic.

Other explicitly systematic contributions take up the more modest aim of reading PR in light of other parts of the system, in particular the logic. Angelica Nuzzo interprets the logic in light of Hegel's account of action in PR, arguing that the "'absolute method' that concludes the Logic presents the structure of a 'logic of action,'" that presents action "in its pure forms, independently of the nature, position, and historical constitution of the agent that carries it out." (105) Thom Brooks defends a non-retributivist interpretation of Hegel's account of punishment in PR, basing his interpretation in part on relevant remarks from the logic. Liz Disley asks about the fate of autonomy within Hegelian Sittlichkeit by considering its relation to morality.

In an ambitious and engaging essay, Katerina Deligiorgi looks to the logic's account of "individuals" to make sense of Hegel's criticisms of liberal individualism. Drawing on Geach's account of universals in Aquinas, she defends a formal account of the concept of "individual," according to which "individual" is an "incomplete" concept whose determination requires attention to a portion of reality or "spirit" that the expression is supposed to stand for: "When we seek to characterize the portion of spirit we pick out with the term 'individual,' we commit ourselves to referring to worldly specifics." (193) Instead of understanding the human individual to be a "simple," irreducible to something else, Hegel's concept of an individual refers necessarily to social roles and practices.

Robert Pippin and Paul Redding offer less straightforward, but equally interesting, considerations of PR in light of specific ideas from the logic, stressing the centrality of the concept of "actuality" in the philosophy of objective spirit. On Pippin's account, Hegel defends an Aristotelian conception of actuality as "the being-at-work or energeia of [a] thing's distinct mode of being." (74) By stressing the concept of actuality, Pippin believes he can offer an account of PR that demonstrates the essential limitations of particular, contingently existing social institutions by appeal to ideas from the logic. In particular, he points to the "conceptual insufficiency" of civil society as the actualization of the concept of freedom. Even if Hegel cannot "deduce" the specific institutions of the state from the concept, the logic provides a critical tool for understanding political life.

Redding, too, identifies actuality as a central concept of Hegel's logic. Through an analysis of Hegel's treatment of judgment in the logic, he argues that Hegel is a "modal actualist," who understands the aim of philosophy not to be the "traditional Aristotelian goal of metaphysics as knowledge of the necessary or essential." Instead, for Redding's Hegel, "Philosophical knowledge is knowledge of the actual world as actual, and as such has to be understood from a reflectively mediated perspective within it." (40) The great success of Hegel's project, according to Redding, is that Hegel is able to engage in a project of radical redescription akin to the one that Rorty defends that takes account of the subject's place within the world, but without giving up the idea of "truth."

Essays in a final group offer reconstructions of PR as a whole. Drawing heavily on Michael Thompson's accounts of life, action, and persons, Terry Pinkard offers an ambitious reconstruction of the standpoint of PR that aims to show how we can reconcile the social and historical characteristics of that work with the apparently timeless and eternal concepts of the logic. Richard Dien Winfield draws the structure and aims of Hegel's practical philosophy from that of the logic, pointing to the centrality of the concept of self-determination to both accounts. Finally, Kenneth Westphal offers a broad account of PR as a defense of "natural law constructivism": Even if the principles of justice are rooted in facts about the "nature" of "finite, mutually interdependent beings," (260) Hegel eschews moral realism in favor of a constructivism that takes account of the universality condition on norms stemming from Kant, and the non-domination condition on social arrangements stemming from Rousseau. For Westphal, Hegel's theory of Sittlichkeit is a continuation of Kant's project of a "practical anthropology," oriented to understanding the ways in which these principles can be "realized" in existing social forms. (261)

We can therefore see that, in some ways, the contributors re-hash familiar debates in Hegel studies -- for example, when we contrast Stein's account of philosophical knowledge as the self-thinking of absolute Geist with Redding's account of philosophical knowledge as knowledge of the actual world possessed by individuals who belong to that world and whose knowledge is conditioned by it. However, what divides these two accounts is not necessarily a different conception of the role of system and method in Hegel, but, rather, differing conceptions of the metaphysical character of Hegel's thought. It is in this connection that I think we can identify two of the volume's greatest missed opportunities.

In recent years, we have witnessed a resurgence of interest in the English-speaking world in Hegel's logic and metaphysics that has generated a vibrant discussion. I am thinking in particular of the work of scholars like Robert Stern, Brady Bowman, RocĂ­o Zambrana, and James Kreines. At the same time, the specific implications of this return to the logic for our understanding of PR have not yet been developed. (Though Christopher Yeomans has worked to draw out some of these implications for Hegel's theory of action.) Had the contributions here attended to these implications in a substantive way, this collection could have made a unique and distinctive contribution to this vibrant discussion. At the same time, given the indirect role played by metaphysical questions in this volume, it would have been helpful for the contributors to dwell more explicitly on the other great trend in English-language Hegel scholarship of the past thirty years, the post-Kantian interpretation, developed most prominently by Robert Pippin. To be sure, the contributions by Pippin and Pinkard here do carry on the sort of account of the logic that Pippin began to develop in his first Hegel book. And it is interesting to see Pippin make explicit appeal to Aristotelian ideas to make sense of Hegel's logic. But none of the defenders of more traditional readings consider the implications of their accounts of method and system for the metaphysical questions raised by those post-Kantian interpretations.

Both of these developments present important challenges to some of the assumptions around which the systematic/anti-systematic debate is structured. If it turns out that Hegel's logic and metaphysics are not dead letters, but instead remain live options, that should call into question Wood's suggestion that we ought to jettison the logic to save the insights of the practical philosophy. In his critical remarks concerning the logic, Wood continues to stress the ways in which Hegel's work has been made obsolete by subsequent developments in logical theory. But he does not address the contribution that Hegel's logic is supposed to make to metaphysics. At the same time, that should also indicate that the task for critics of Wood cannot consist only in showing that we can understand Hegel's texts only if we take account of his dialectical and speculative method, but also in addressing the question of whether we can appropriate Hegel's thought without dismissing significant parts of it that we deem to be outmoded. In short, the real action in dealing with these issues may not lie in questions about whether we should understand Hegel as a systematic thinker or not, but rather in the status of his metaphysics.

These concerns aside, this volume contains a range of engaging and interesting essays on the relation between Hegel's PR and other parts of his system, many of which merit serious consideration and study.