Hegel's Theory of Intelligibility

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Rocío Zambrana, Hegel's Theory of Intelligibility, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 182pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226280110.

Reviewed by Paul Redding, University of Sydney


Agreement about what Hegel's Science of Logic is not is easily achieved: no one expects to find in it anything like what would be expected of a contemporary work in the science now called "logic". Beyond that, however, positive accounts of what is to be found within it stretch from views of it as the last and most extravagant gasp within European high culture of an earlier onto-theological outlook that came to be progressively challenged in modernity, to that of its being a self-consistent expression of all the core commitments of European modernity itself.

Within the last couple of decades, one broad division within the array of contested claims surrounding the nature of Hegel's logical project has separated responses to Robert Pippin's Hegel's Idealism.[1] Pippin there argued for a conception of Hegel as a, perhaps the, modernist philosopher -- a critic of that earlier "dogmatic metaphysics" from which Kant aspired, not entirely successfully, to escape. For Pippin, most, if not all, of the connotations of Hegel's key concept that might worry the modernist -- the concept of "spirit" (Geist) -- can be sidelined by correctly placing it in relation to Kant's notion of the "transcendental unity of apperception". "Spirit" is not the name of some spooky non-natural substance. Rather, at its heart is the type of normative requirement that any finite rational individual integrate their beliefs into a consistent whole. This is the demand for unification expressed in the moral context in Kant by the idea of acting on the Categorical Imperative.

Many welcomed Pippin's liberation of Hegel from the earlier prevailing picture of super-extravagant metaphysician. For others, however, his post-Kantian reading had gone too far. Pippin, some said, had been too eager to read back into Hegel the sorts of anti-metaphysical views popular within twentieth-century analytic philosophy, driven by the desire to sanitize Hegel for a modern, secular and broadly liberal readership. There have been other sources of resistance as well. The language of Pippin's more analytic-leaning reading of Hegel that allowed him to engage with some leading philosophers within that genre, especially Robert Brandom, could be seen as exemplifying one side of that more general analytic -- continental divide splitting philosophical culture over the last hundred years. Moreover, to complicate things further, in both analytic philosophy and, more recently, in its continental other, substantive metaphysical approaches have reappeared, with espousals of more straightforwardly metaphysical or ontological "realism" seemingly on the rise.

Rocío Zambrana's book helps us to start seeing beyond all these divisions. On a first reading, she comes out as a qualified but clear supporter of Pippin's post-Kantian reading. Like Pippin, Zambrana criticizes approaches that treat Hegel's logic as expressive of an ontology -- in this work, a position effectively represented by Stephen Houlgate -- and describes Pippin as showing that "Hegel's philosophy seems to inherit the 'apperception theme' in Kant. Like Kant's, Hegel's idealism elaborates the conditions for unity and hence determinacy of any possible object of thought" (p. 8). But Zambrana picks up on and develops an aspect of Pippin's reading that had become explicit only in his later work.[2] This concerns a displacement from Kant's concern with "transcendental conditions" to that of reflexivity as a feature of actuality (Wirklichkeit). This points to an interpretation of Hegel's idealism as a "theory of the historical development of norms, one that supports a theory of radical conceptual change" (p. 8). Hegel's logic is thus an elucidation of the logic of normative practices and institutions as they appear throughout human history. It is about, as she quotes Pippin, the "self-sufficiency of reason's own authority" -- the Hegelian theme that transforms Kant's moral idea of freedom as self-governance -- but a self-sufficiency that is always manifest under specific historical conditions.

Zambrana thus focuses on the notions of actuality and actualization as holding the key to Hegel's logic, and in the course of this stresses the centrality of the notion of negativity for Hegel, a theme more at home within recent deconstructive or continental readings of Hegel than in the analytic-leaning approaches of the likes of Pippin and Brandom. For Zambrana negativity is, in fact, the key to the form of intelligibility itself in Hegel: it is a form that "calls into question the assumption that the content of any normative commitment retains authority or stability within a historically specific form of life" (p. 7).

In short, Hegel's logic is an attempt to account for the articulation of intelligibility itself in terms of normative practices and institutions that are essentially fragile and subject to constant change and even reversal. With this focus on negativity, Hegel, Zambrana believes, comes out as even more a modernist than even Pippin's reading allows. It is a view of modernity more attuned to the radical ambivalence that modernity has to its inhabitants.

With this focus on actuality and actualization, Zambrana, I believe, goes further towards changing the terrain of these current disputes than the description given above, largely paraphrasing Zambrana's own, suggests. This is signaled by the fact that one might just as easily read her account as a presentation of Hegel's logic as a type of metaphysics, and even a type of realist metaphysics, in line with the aspirations of some of Pippin's critics. Here, a comparison of Zambrana's book with another recent significant contribution to these issues, James Kreines's Reason in the World,[3] might be helpful. While there is a certain complementarity between their themes, Kreines tends to locates his own work on the other side of the divide created by Pippin's work, which suggests to me that there is some significant reconfiguration of the landscape taking place in these two works. Zambrana goes a considerable way in specifying the nature of this reconfiguration.

Kreines is critical of those who see Hegel as inheriting those dimensions of Kant's critique of metaphysics that start from a type of skepticism about the epistemic credentials of metaphysical knowledge. Along with interpreters such as Robert Stern, Kreines wants to restore a more substantive metaphysics -- a metaphysics of reason -- to Hegel. However, it is clear that Zambrana is as equally concerned as Kreines with "reason in the world", and is also opposed to what Kreines calls the epistemology first approach to metaphysics. But Zambrana's focus might be described a little more determinately as "reason in the actual world", and if this sounds like a distinction without a difference, I'll appeal to distinctions that have emerged within contemporary modal metaphysics that might help clarify issues here.

In modal metaphysics over the last three or four decades, actualism has been shaped in reaction to the type of Leibniz-like possibilist metaphysics, as found in David Lewis,[4] who, in accounting for the semantics of modal judgments, invoked possible worlds as concrete realities -- concrete analogues of the actual world. The actualist, in contrast, believes that the actual world is all there is of reality, and so possibility must be somehow accommodated within the actual -- in Robert Stalnaker's work, for example, as abstracta or unrealized properties of the actual world.[5] In his treatment of "Actuality", the category with which his Objective Logic concludes, Hegel has formulae suggesting just this kind of conception. For example, in the Encyclopaedia Logic he describes possibility as "the reflection-into-itself which, as in contrast with the concrete unity of the actual, is taken and made an abstract and unessential essentiality". "Possibility" he goes on "is what is essential to reality, but in such a way that it is at the same time only a possibility."[6]

In contrast to the actualist's stance, Kant's epistemologically grounded position on the determinacy of thought might be thought of as a variant of the rival possibilism of Leibniz and Lewis. Of course Kant did not subscribe to Leibniz's metaphysics (and would be equally horrified by Lewis's), but he nevertheless seemed to think that we finite rational knowers have a type of ersatz version of the knowledge possessed by Leibniz's God, an a priori knowledge of the contents of all possible worlds. From Kant's perspective we can't, of course, have that knowledge, but we can know a priori the form of all possible appearances. We have a priori knowledge of the necessary conditions of all experience itself.[7] It is just this conception of possibility that Stalnaker, for example, rejects when he insists that we can know nothing a priori about the logical structure or "space" of possibility.[8] All the semantic resources for understanding possibility must come from what we find and make judgments about in the actual world. For her part, Zambrana succinctly portrays Hegel as an actualist critic of this kind of Kantian possibilism when she writes:

Ideality cannot be specified a priori . . . Determinacy depends on conditions that are not only existent, but that can only established as conditions after the fact. . . . [Reflexivity] cannot be a matter of possibility, of an infinity of relations. It is a matter of actuality, of concrete conditions (p. 71).[9]

The significance of this for the understanding of metaphysics is, I think, considerable. For Aristotle, philosophy aspired to know the necessary while history was relegated to the much more modest epistemic status of knowledge of the merely actual. In contrast to Plato, of course, Aristotle was an "actualist" in another sense, so philosophy might be thought of as aiming at something like the necessary in the actual -- in Leibnizian terms, this would be described as finding in the actual world truths that would hold in all possible worlds. But this is what the contemporary actualist, and Hegel, on Zambrana's account, as I understand it, contests. The philosophical object just is the actual world with its internally "reflected" possibilities that are in the process of being, or not being, realized, by creatures (us) with the capacities to reflectively grasp and act on these possibilities.

Zambrana's path to this understanding of actuality is via Pippin, and to some degree, Brandom, as the form of thought must always be grasped in relation to content-determining practices that have become actual within a particular form of life or spirit. As Stalnaker stresses, the conceptual resources for reflection must come from the actual world. This is where the theme of the unity of form and content links in to that of actuality and the process of actualization. If there is no abstract form that is not embedded or embodied in the concrete practices of a specific community, then there is no sense to exploring the structure of possibility in isolation from reflection of the actual epistemic contents endorsed within such a community. This is where Zambrana's project looks like Kreines's but described in a Pippinian way.

Normatively articulated forms of life are essentially precarious and ambivalent, and it is this stress on negativity, precariousness and ambivalence that Zambrana sees as aligning her reading of Hegel with more continental ones. But while there is a type of Derridean undecidability here as an irreducible feature of intelligibility, this does not apply to the meta-level claim concerning the negativity of form and the necessity of content. This is the only ahistorical principle in the face of an entirely historicist account of human practices and institutions with their historically given and historical changing forms of normative authority.

I have tried to sketch what I see as the main themes running through Zambrana's thoughtful and powerfully suggestive book. She packs much into a relatively short space and there is much more that could be discussed. By necessity, the exposition and argumentation proceeds at a fairly high level of generality, and at a brisk clip. On any number of points a reader might want more detail. Moreover, some aspects of the book seem to me to be in tension with her actualist reading of Hegel. In particular, throughout the book she characterizes Kant as insisting on "the first-person perspective" in both theoretical and practical philosophy (e.g., pp. 3, 6, 50), a perspective from which Hegel moves away in the direction of his focus on the properly communal practices of spirit (pp. 14, 120). This is a tendency she also criticizes in Brandom (p. 131). I wonder, however, if the situation she is aiming at might be better described in terms of Hegel's critique of Kant's denial of the first-person perspective, and that of his (Hegel's) attempt to restore and do justice to such a perspective within the social framework of spirit?

Some contemporary actualists stress the ineliminability of indexicality from thought -- the need to keep in play in some sense the first-person point of view. That there is a version of the "essential indexical" thesis suggested in Hegel's actualism seems to be expressed in a passage Zambrana quotes from Hegel's Philosophy of Right: "Here is the rose, dance here" (p. 84). As bearers of a determinate form of actualized spirit we always know and act in the world from somewhere in particular. But while Zambrana seems to hold actual communal forms of spirit itself to this demand, with her rejection of the first-person perspective she seems not to acknowledge this at the level of its actual individual bearers. That one wants to hear more on these topics, or that one is likely to be drawn into debates over specific points, however, in this case reflect the depth and complexity of the issues into which Zambrana leads the reader in this important book.


An earlier version of this review was presented at an author-meets-critic session of the 2016 Annual Meeting of the Pacific Division of the American Philosophical Association. I wish to thank fellow critics Karen Ng and Chris Yeomans, as well as Rocío Zambrana, for helpful feedback.

[1] Robert B. Pippin, Hegel's Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness (Cambridge University Press, 1989).

[2] Robert B. Pippin, Hegel's Practical Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 2006).

[3] James Kreines, Reason in the World: Hegel's Metaphysics and its Philosophical Appeal (Oxford University Press, 2015).

[4] For example, David Lewis, Counterfactuals (Blackwell, 1973) and On the Plurality of Worlds (Blackwell, 1986).

[5] See, for example, Robert Stalnaker, Ways a World Might Be: Metaphysical and Anti-Metaphysical Essays (Oxford University Press, 2003), and Mere Possibilities: Metaphysical Foundations of Modal Semantics (Princeton University Press, 2012).

[6] G. W. F. Hegel, The Encyclopaedia Logic, trans. W. Wallace, Oxford University Press, 1975, VIII, C. Actuality, § 143. An excellent account of this issue is to be found in Karen Ng, "Hegel's Logic of Actuality", Review of Metaphysics, 63 (2009): 139 -- 172.

[7] This is just the sort of a priori knowledge that Stern is critical of in Kant, for example. Robert Stern, Hegelian Metaphysics (Oxford University Press, 2012).

[8] C.f., Stalnaker, Mere Possibility, ch 2.

[9] There are a number of places where Zambrana expresses Hegel's approach in ways that resonate with Stalnaker's approach to intelligibility. For example, Zambrana: "The activity of reason is a matter of distinction-making by and within a shape of Geist." Stalnaker:

Rational activities such as deliberation, contemplation, inquiry, communication all essentially involve an agent who is distinguishing between possibilities. . . . To understand what a speaker is doing when she says how things are, we need to understand how she is distinguishing between different ways that things might be (Robert Stalnaker, Context and Content (Oxford University Press, 1999), p. 4).

Remember that Stalnaker insists that this sort of distinguishing can only be done with the resources available in the actual world -- that is, within a particular "shape of Geist".