Hegel’s Theory of Normativity: The Systematic Foundations of the Philosophical Science of Right

Hegels Theory Of Normativity

Kevin Thompson, Hegel’s Theory of Normativity: The Systematic Foundations of the Philosophical Science of Right, Northwestern University Press, 2019, 117pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810139923.

Reviewed by Joshua Wretzel, The Pennsylvania State University


Kevin Thompson’s book on normativity in Hegel makes an original contribution to one of the central issues in Hegel studies. For Thompson focuses his attention on the systematic underpinnings of norms that, in Hegel’s eyes, provide the conditions for the possibility of norms in the first place. In what follows, I shall situate Thompson’s book in the whole of Hegel studies before summarizing the central arguments of the book. I then offer some thoughts about four crucial lacunae in Thompson’s otherwise impressive, well-argued study.

We are far enough into the so-called “Hegel renaissance” in the English-speaking world that the term itself now sounds a bit dated. For it is now more than thirty years since the flurry of activity in Hegel’s corner of the philosophical universe began in earnest. It has since spread from its interest in the interweaving of epistemology and socio-political philosophy and its concentration on the Jena Phenomenology of Spirit and the Philosophy of Right. These days, one finds that the focus has shifted away from such themes and works, in such a way that it may be right to speak of a “second wave” of the Hegelian renaissance. Indeed, one can hardly begin to read a book on Hegel without also confronting his Science of Logic and Philosophy of Nature, all in ways that reimagine the anti-metaphysical and anti-naturalist stances dominant in Hegel studies during the late eighties, nineties, and early aughts.

Still, we have reached a point in this renaissance where reflection on central, unifying themes has become possible, and it is arguable that no theme has loomed larger over the last three decades of Hegel research than Hegel’s theory of normativity. For according to “first-wave” Hegelians, Hegel both developed and relied upon a robust theory of normativity in order to defend what were thought to be his anti-metaphysical and anti-naturalist theses. There is a rich history at work here, which dates back at least to the seventies, but the level of interest in Hegel really blossomed after Robert B. Pippin’s 1989 classic, Hegel’s Idealism. There, Pippin argued that, for Hegel, the deliverances of receptivity are always already shot through with a radically socio-historical spontaneity, with the result that all our experiences of the world contain an irreducibly normative component. The core claims of this book were soon adopted by Terry Pinkard (1994), Robert Brandom (1994), and John McDowell (1994) so that, by the turn of the 21st century, theories of normativity were commonplace in studies of Hegel.

Again, the tide has since shifted, so that recent works defend both a more robust metaphysics at work in Hegel (see, e.g., Bowman (2013) and Kreines (2015)) and a fuller appreciation of the connection between nature and spirit (Yeomans 2011, Sedgwick 2012, Ng 2020). This is not to say that first-wave-inflected books do not still appear (Brandom 2019), but they are less common than they were, say, 15–20 years ago. Such is the context in which Thompson’s book appears. It is an attempt to address the place of norms in Hegel while remaining sensitive to the matters of metaphysics and nature in his thought.

At a slight 136 pages, Thompson’s book is thus a small book on a very large topic. This is not, in itself, a bad thing, nor is it unique in Hegel studies. For instance, Pippin has published a series of lectures on a similarly large topic, Hegel on Self-Consciousness, which together make a fine, short book. But books on Hegel do tend towards the longer side of things, and when one encounters a smaller book, the impulse is to wonder what went missing. In this case, Thompson could have done more to address the fine-grained presence of systematic thinking in Hegel’s Philosophy of Right, and could have engaged more deeply with secondary literature on Hegel, contemporary theories of normativity, and like-minded political theorists such as  Kant and Fichte. We shall discuss these matters more fully, below.

Again, the overall thesis is that Hegel’s theory of normativity is fundamentally and inextricably linked to his deeper, systematic holdings from the Science of Logic and elsewhere. For it is only as part of his systematic enterprise, Hegel thinks, that any normative holdings may escape the charge of dogmatism. I want to be able to show that I do not hold my norms just because, but that I hold them for the right reasons. In Hegel’s time, that meant defeating dogmatism and the so-called “Agrippan trilemma”: one must avoid either vicious circularity, an infinite regress, or an arbitrary stopping point in one’s reasoning. And Hegel thought it was only the unique form of reasoning present in his system that allowed one to evade the trilemma. The story is longer than I can offer to tell here, but reasons in Hegel’s system are linked in such a way that tracing the lineage of one always leads to other parts of the system, and never in a way that mimics reasoning in any of the horns of the trilemma.

Thompson speaks of three features of Hegel’s system that allow him to evade the Agrippan skeptic. For one, it consists of an immanent form of development: this means that Hegel begins from a presuppositionless standpoint—it makes no assumptions about objects of investigation, their content, or the method of investigating them—but must, as Thompson says, “faithfully observe the way the matter at issue develops wholly of itself and thus how it itself demands to be thought” (26). For another, the system proceeds by means of necessary entailment: the various moments of the system follow one another necessarily and without any gaps between them: each later moment is merely a more determinate unfolding of the earlier moments and follows, in each case, the implicit logical structure within those earlier moments. And finally, the system exhibits a retrogressive form of grounding, according to which later parts of the system come to underlie the earlier parts. The system is, in Hegel’s words, a “circle of circles” that justifies its own claims from within its own, inherent logical structure. The logical density of such a system allows it to justify its claims without remainder and entirely from within itself.

Thompson correctly maintains that this is the proper way to understand Hegel’s theory of normativity: it is part of a broader system with broader commitments to defeat dogmatism on the one hand and skepticism on the other. So described, Thompson shows clearly and forcefully how Hegel’s Philosophy of Right marks a significant advancement over earlier, so-called “representationalist” approaches to political philosophy. Among other things, Hegel criticizes the way representationalist approaches in philosophy take the object of investigation for granted as given. In the realm of political philosophy, this means treating right as a given: one roots it either in something like natural law or in feeling, sentimentality, or tradition. Instead, Hegel begins with an investigation of right as right, and proceeds by unfolding or making explicit a logic that lies implicit within it. The full articulation of that logic—what Thompson calls “the complete relational actuality of right” or the “world of authoritative social institutions and practices” (33)—constitutes the “idea” of right. It does not proceed from the existence of right to certain normative or political consequences of right, but by further exploring into the logical structure of it. In a proto-phenomenological fashion, it attends to the matters of right themselves, in such a way that each further moment of the progression is not a movement beyond right, but only a further articulation of it. In this way, the philosophical science of right exhibits the same immanent, necessary, self-developing structure present within the system as a whole.

As Thompson points out, this formulation gives us insight into several key formulations of Hegel’s text. For instance, in § 29, Hegel says that “right is therefore in general freedom, as idea.” This quote, which Thompson also utilizes as the epigraph for chapter 2, just means that right expresses the full logic of freedom, made explicit. If we want to think about what freedom is, Hegel thinks, we end up thinking about right. And if we want to think about what right is, then we end up with, well, Hegel’s Philosophy of Right. The various categories and divisions of right which follow are necessarily entailed by the thinking of right, if only we are able to suspend our limiting preconceptions and let the matter of right fully hold sway. And those elements of right which are thereby articulated provide the grounding conditions of right: they describe the rational order of things that must obtain in order for right to fully realize itself as right.

Thompson also does well to note the natural progression of right, providing an account of the way right emerges from out of a natural condition. This further sets Thompson apart from “first-wave” Hegelians, where an anti-naturalism tends to predominate. For thinkers like Pippin, the emergence of Geist represents a sharp break, a rupture in the fabric of nature. But for more recent commentators, the transition to Geist represents what I have called “the continuation of Natur by other means” (Wretzel 2019). The processes of self-causality predominant in organic nature recur in Geist, with the difference that Geist gradually comes to awareness of those self-causing processes. This is what it means for Geist to be the return of the idea from out of the other and back into itself.

This is the only way to account, as Thompson does in chapter 2, for the emergence of will from out of impulse [Trieb]. Hegel’s narrative begins with a subject overwhelmed by contradictory, because self-external, impulses—it bears mentioning that, when Hegel speaks of the subject, “self-external” just means “natural”—each having an equal claim on the activity of the subject. Thompson masterfully describes the process by which the subject internalizes this externality, settling upon one of these impulses and “resolving” to act. This “resolving upon” some action is the birth of will for Hegel: it is a sublation of impulse that is, itself, an outgrowth of impulse. This constitutes the first criterion of free action for Thompson, the so-called “self-determination criterion.”

But of course these progressions in Hegel are polyvalent: what appears from one aspect as the internalization of the idea from out of its other, appears from another aspect as the externalization of the subject through action: its ends are realized, made objective. This constitutes the second criterion of free action for Thompson: the objectivity condition. For Hegel, the point is to create, through action, the objective conditions that undergird free action in the first place. This, again, is Thompson’s “retrogressive grounding” and the conditions that enable free action are just what Hegel calls “right.”

For Thompson, other accounts of the social conditions for the possibility of free action do not go deeply enough into the deduction of those background conditions. He mentions, broadly, “linguistic” and “recognitional” models of social organization and opposes their un-Hegelian, because anti-systematic, approaches to normativity. He writes: “Each takes social life, and its interrelations, for granted; they presuppose the irreducibly shared rules and conventions of society that transcend the agency of individuals” (68). This refers even to first-wave readings of Hegel’s social ontology that try to account for the core elements of his thought on these matters without also examining the deeper, systematic features that entail them. Once again, the theme of continuity versus rupture of Hegelian thinking recurs: Thompson mentions Nicolai Hartmann’s reading, which holds that “the concept of Objective Spirit is not a consequence of the system or a product of the dialectical train of thought” (67). Thus, the real contemporary value of Hegel, for Thompson, is his willingness to deduce right, to show how and where his social theory develops from out of his more basic systematic commitments.

For Thompson, these commitments involve showing how the objectivity of freedom, or right, is both normative and ontological. It is normative in so far as the will “accords with its own concept,” or develops organically from out of right’s own self-thinking. And it is ontological in so far as “the will fulfills its ends in external existence,” or is objectively realized by means of practical action. Again, the aim of right, for Hegel, is for freedom to beget freedom: for free action to create the concrete conditions for the possibility of free action. Thompson thereby sets up the Philosophy of Right, generally, as the immanent, necessary unfolding of freedom’s self-grounding.

Thompson’s study closes with an examination of what he calls Hegel’s “critical theory.” The question is of what import Hegel’s systematic deduction is for concrete, historically situated subjects as citizens of a modern society. We may understand these subjects as thrust into a world that seems rife with contingency and immediacy, who thereby understand socio-political events as atomic, independent occurrences unrelated to a past or any sort of unfolding of a rational order. Hegel’s task, as Thompson sees it, is first to motivate that subject’s interest in the rationality of the political, and then subsequently, to lay out that rationality in systematic (immanent, necessary, retrogressively grounded) form. These are what Thompson calls the “extra-systematic” and “systematic” uses of reason, respectively. The first is operative in Hegel’s prefaces and introductions and may make use of representation and rhetorical appeals. The latter functions in the text proper and is to be, as far as possible, the pure unfolding of the systematic, rational structure of thought. The aim, in both cases, is to elevate the subject from out of that atomistic, contingent appearance of things, to cultivate them to the standpoint of the rational unfolding of (in this case) right in history, and so to be able to identify the thread of necessity weaving through this seeming contingency.

I agree with many of Thompson’s central theses, find his arguments mainly well-reasoned and thoughtful, and am impressed by his philological knowledge of Hegel’s texts. Readers who are interested in dense, thorough analyses of the systematic framework of Hegel’s political thought will find much here to their satisfaction. But as I said above, this is a small book on a very large topic, and there are, again, at least four areas where some more sustained analysis is called for.

For one, the book understates just how thoroughly Hegel’s systematic commitments underwrite his Philosophy of Right. Thompson does well to point to the broad features of immanence, necessary entailment, and retrogressive grounding, and situates the project, as he should, within the encyclopedic system as a whole. But there is so much more to say on this topic: for instance, Thompson never discusses how the immanent and necessary unfolding of right mimics the broader, systematic structure of immediacy, mediation, and mediated immediacy in the shapes of abstract right, morality, and ethical life. And it is surprising how little mention is made of the Logic, which is where discussions of Hegel’s systematic commitments rightly tend to begin. He does spend some time developing the logic of individuality, particularity, and universality, but stops short of providing an account of concrete vs. abstract universality, though he mentions the former in several places. Hegel is also quite deliberate in his terminological choices throughout his writings precisely for the purpose of making the systematic continuity of his thought evident. Thompson makes much, for instance, of Hegel’s claim that “Right is any existence [Dasein] in general that is the existence of the free will” (§ 29). It matters that Hegel chose the terms he did; he spends time in the Logic distinguishing Dasein from, say, Existenz and the difference between the two is meant to inform our understanding of Hegel’s choices here. Some more fine-grained analyses of this type might have helped to strengthen his case for the continuity (and not rupture) that exists between the Philosophy of Right and the rest of Hegel’s works.

For another, the text would have benefitted from a deeper, more sustained treatment of secondary literature on Hegel. As a “second-wave” treatment of the Philosophy of Right, Thompson makes a strong claim against some of the most influential texts in Hegelian philosophy over the last quarter century or so. Yet hardly any mentions are made of the formative texts for the position Thompson wishes to reject. We are left with a vague notion that there are readings that take for granted, undersell, or neglect to consider the deeper systematic commitments of Hegel’s theory of normativity. But we are missing, once again, the fine grain that lets us understand just how these views go wrong and how they stand to benefit from Thompson’s treatment of Hegel. There is little, here, to convince one who has read these first-wave texts that they ought to prefer Thompson’s reading instead.

Thirdly, the book also does very little to engage contemporary Hegelian-inflected philosophy. Again, we are left with a vague notion that there are such works out there: the broad reference to “linguistic” and “recognitional” approaches to social philosophy. But insofar as it seems central to Thompson’s core theses not only that Hegel’s systematic features underlie his socio-political holdings, but that it matters philosophically as well, Thompson needs to do more to sell the skeptical contemporary philosopher on Hegel. We need to hear much more about where, why, and how these approaches take “social life, and its interrelations, for granted” and how Hegel’s particular approach does not in a way that still speaks to a contemporary audience.

Finally, Thompson does well to situate Hegel with respect to many of his contemporaries, pointing out the “representationalist” tendencies of both romantic and natural law theorists. But it is easy to leave Thompson’s text with the impression that Hegel’s Philosophy of Right was alone in its struggle against dogmatism in the political philosophy of the era. In actuality, Hegel’s texts were heavily influenced by political works by Kant and Fichte, and his response to representationalism involved also a response to others who were involved in his struggle against romanticism and natural law theory. Some commentary on how these other thinkers were not, themselves, anti-representationalist enough would have been helpful.

Overall, I recommend Thompson’s text for those with an interest in Hegel’s political thought and its historical context. Its analyses are strong and clear and Thompson’s solid knowledge of the core texts is undeniable.


Bowman, Brady (2013). Hegel and the Metaphysics of Absolute Negativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Brandom, Robert B. (2019). A Spirit of Trust: A Reading of Hegel’s Phenomenology. Cambridge: Belknap.

Brandom, Robert B. (1994). Making It Explicit: Reasoning, Representing, and Discursive Commitment. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Kreines, James (2015). Reason in the World: Hegel’s Metaphysics and Its Philosophical Appeal. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Pippin, Robert B. (1989). Hegel’s Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Ng, Karen (2020). Hegel’s Concept of Life: Self-Consciousness, Freedom, Logic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Sedgwick, Sally (2012). Hegel’s Critique of Kant: From Dichotomy to Identity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wretzel, Joshua (2019). “Constraint and the Ethical Agent: Hegel Between Constructivism and Realism” in Stein and Gledhill (eds.) Hegel and Contemporary Practical Philosophy: Beyond Kantian Constructivism. New York: Routledge.

Yeomans, Christopher (2011). Freedom and Reflection: Hegel and the Logic of Agency. Oxford: Oxford University Press.