Hegel's Theory of Responsibility

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Mark Alznauer, Hegel's Theory of Responsibility, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 218pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107078123.

Reviewed by Arto Laitinen, University of Tampere


This book addresses two main topics: the nature and conditions of responsible agency (the 'status' of being responsible), and the nature and conditions of responsible action (the 'state' of being responsible for something). It argues that the main puzzles about Hegel's theory of agency and action can be satisfactory solved when we understand they are really about responsible agency and action. Alznauer holds that responsible action should not be seen as a subclass of a broader category of action, but actions are defined as those effectively willed changes in our environment that we are responsible for. This is a subclass of broader categories of practical activity and willing, but Alznauer argues that the something is "action" only when linked to responsibility.

The book does not focus centrally on arguments for or against rival views on the nature of responsibility, on for example debates on shared or collective responsibility, or the role of personal responsibility in the just distribution of burdens. The book is really an argument about how to understand actions and agency. The main opponents he argues against are Michael Quante, Charles Taylor, and Robert Pippin. Alznauer succeeds in articulating a position that is different from these three, has its strengths, and is worth developing further. The book is well written, accessible, and clear, which is an especially praiseworthy feature of books on Hegel.


Alznauer initially introduces the relevant sense of "responsibility", Schuld, by starting with moral responsibility as praise- or blameworthiness, openness to moral evaluations for what you do. Such responsibility is objective, "not dependent on the subject's choice to accept it" (4). Given that for Hegel, Morality is just one normative sphere in addition to Abstract Right (roughly, legality) and Ethical Life (roughly, concrete duties and tasks that come with our social roles and stations), Alznauer holds that the relevant sense of objective responsibility covers openness to evaluation in all these three respects (5). Responsibility is openness to normative -- rightful, moral and ethical -- evaluation in light of ends the agent cannot reject.

One aspect of this definition raises questions: "openness to evaluation in light of ends the agent cannot reject" (6, italics added.). Instead of "ends" the definition could say "features" or "demands" that the agent cannot reject, whether or not they are ends the agent has in fact adopted or set out to pursue. Ends sound like intentions, plans or goals the agent in fact has adopted, whereas responsibility seems to concern also ends that one should adopt and pursue, whether or not one has. Alznauer consistently writes that for Hegel objective claims, demands, or reasons are contingent on "having come to recognize that one has them" (58). And recognizing reasons is willing them: "If someone takes herself to have an objective reason not to steal something, for example, this end necessarily continues to represent her will even if she desires to steal that thing or chooses to steal it" (59). For Alznauer's Hegel, then, four things go together: the ends that the agent in fact wills; objective reasons there are for the agent to act; objective reasons the agent recognizes, and responsibility (evaluability in light of those objective ends/reasons). While in the case of an ideally virtuous and practically rational agent these will indeed come together, it is not clear why there could not be objective reasons one has not recognized, but should recognize, or why all recognized reasons would have in all cases to be willed ends for the agent.


The main puzzle or paradox about agency that the book sets out to solve is how to fit together Hegel's view that responsible agency is our essential nature on the one hand, but, on the other hand, a historical and social achievement constituted by social recognition and self-conception on the other hand.

As a preliminary to discussing this, Chapter One takes up Hegel's theory of the will. Free will has three moments (the capacity to negate any inclination, the capacity to set oneself an end, and the capacity to still see the end as "mine" once it is realized in the external world). It can be actualized in three different shapes, the last of which is the full realization of the concept of will. The first two shapes, the "natural" and "arbitrary" wills are developmental stages towards the fully "rational" will -- they are not yet "for themselves" what they are "in themselves". Alznauer argues that arriving at the self-conception of oneself as free -- having a rational will -- is a necessary condition for responsibility (21).

Chapter Two discusses responsible agency from the illuminating viewpoint of "innocence" in the sense of not being fit to be held responsible. A responsible, non-innocent, agent must meet three conditions: first, have the required psychological capacities; second, have the self-conception of oneself as free; third, be a recognized member of the state (21, 85).

There are accordingly three ways in which beings can be "innocent". They can first of all lack the psychological capacities needed for responsibility. There are three of these, and Alznauer illustrates them with Hegel's views about animals, children and "the mentally deranged" (who suffer from local irrationalities thanks to obsessions and fixed ideas):

An individual must be capable of thought (unlike an animal), she must be capable of having personal insight into right and wrong (unlike a child), and [ . . . ] her thoughts and desires must be fully responsive to her judgments about the world and about what she has grounds to do (unlike the mentally deranged). (75)

"A normal human adult is one that has all three of these capacities and so fully satisfies the psychological conditions for responsible agency." (75).

There are also sociological conditions of "innocence" that Alznauer highlights with Hegel's views about "savagery, tribal patriarchy, and slavery" (62). These prevent the individual from developing the required self-conception and getting the right kind of recognition. Savagery and tribal patriarchy "do not allow individuals to achieve a certain self-conception, one in which they take themselves to be bound only to those standards whose justification they have insight into." (81). They lack exposure to norms that are understood to be valid only if rationally justified. Slaves typically do not lack such exposure, but they lack the required relation to self:

[Hegel] characterizes the slave as someone who is not conscious of his freedom and so has not yet become 'his own property as distinct from that of others' (PR §57), and he goes on to say that it is precisely in 'the act whereby I take possession of my personality and substantial essence' that 'I make myself [mache mich] a being capable of rights and accountability [Rechts- und Zurechnungsfähigket], morality and religiosity' (PR §66, [Alznauer's] translation) (81).[1]

Such "taking possession of one's personality" may be part of the story why non-human animals are often regarded as not bearing rights, but one may wonder whether it is plausible concerning children: arguably children have rights -- it is wrong to harm them in ways which hinder the actualization of their potentials -- despite them not yet having taken possession of their personality.

Without the requisite self-relation, the agents remain rational and responsible only implicitly and potentially, or "in themselves", but not actually or "for themselves". Unlike for example Robert Brandom's more existentialist Hegel, according to whom also the content of our essence or concept depends on our self-conception, Alznauer's Hegel thinks that the essence or Hegelian "concept" is the same for all of us independently of our different self-interpretations. The self-interpretations make a difference in the degree to which the essence or "concept" is actualized. It is only when we regard ourselves as free, rational beings, and as having objective reasons and necessary ends, that the concept of free will is fully actualized. In this limited respect "humans can change what they are merely by arriving at a different self-conception. When a slave, for example, becomes conscious of his own freedom and refuses to accept his position of dependency, Hegel says he 'makes himself' a 'responsible being' (PR §66R)" (42).

Thus, when non-human animals fight for food or attack each other, they do not violate each others' rights, as they have not constituted themselves as rights-bearing agents:

a true right to our bodies is only generated insofar as that possession is posited as rightful by the agent. In order for any possession to be rightful ownership, the agent needs to be conscious of her freedom, of her status as a person who can rightfully express her will in external existence. (103)

An analogue to Alznauer's position could be a political system where one must register to vote: although voting rights are the same for everyone, one needs to register to vote to get the rights "activated" for oneself. There is no voting in the state of nature, and unless one is socialized in the system one would not have any idea of what is going on. But in addition, one must register oneself, and this registering partly consists in being recognized as a rights-bearer by the registrar.

The relevant kind of self-conception is, according to Alznauer's Hegel, possible only when recognized by others as free. Further,

the kind of recognition responsible agency requires in order to exist fully and completely is political recognition: the sort of recognition that states give their citizens, not the sort that individuals could bilaterally give each other outside of the specific political context of a legitimate state (63).

Alznauer quotes Hegel, PR §258A: "it is only through being a member of a state that the individual himself has objectivity, truth, and ethical life" (84), and that someone who rejects citizenship is "devoid of rights, wholly lacking in dignity". The necessity of recognition from state is a highly interesting thesis, but ultimately it seems that recognition is not directly constitutive of responsible agency for Alznauer: it is merely a precondition of the required self-conception, and a precondition of responsibility.

Alznauer sees Hegel as radicalizing the view of Kant, who thought that ownership of external property is indeterminate in a state of nature (while possession of one's body, or being subject to duties, is not). First of all, outside a shared normative structure or a general will, unilaterally taking something into possession does not obligate others to regard it as property. Second, there is no assurance that others will respect my property. Thirdly, it is indeterminate who owns what in the absence of a shared mechanism of settling disputes. The rights to external property in a state of nature are provisional or tentative, not yet conclusive or valid (89). Those who violate these tentative claims, Kant writes, "do one another no wrong at all" (MM 6:307).

Alznauer's Hegel argues the same is true of all rights and obligations -- there are none in the state of nature (92-3). Alznauer argues then that the state of nature is a normative vacuum. There can be no rights or any "way to wrong [each other] at all" (95), good or evil (87), no independent reasons (97), nor responsible agency -- all there is to being right is taking oneself to be right (96). Evaluability or responsibility depend on "the establishment of some normative framework within which we can be evaluated for what we do. If that framework has social preconditions, then so will action itself." (12). Now the assumption of a total normative vacuum seems to go too far, and in any case Alznauer might not need it. He could try to defend the interesting claims concerning personhood (that actualization of the capacities requires a certain self-conception, which in turn requires recognition) without making such an assumption of a normative vacuum, which is not that plausible (are there not objective reasons, say, to avoid poisonous food outside a political state? Are not the tyrants outside a developed state at all responsible for their deeds? Are there no reasons at all not to torture animals outside a political state?).


Chapters Three and Four deal with action. The central paradox about responsible action that Alznauer tries to solve is that Hegel seems to claim on the one hand that agents are responsible only for their intended actions, and on the other hand, that they are responsible for everything they do, including consequences they could not have foreseen.

Actions in general are that subset of acts of will (expressions of internal ends in external existence) that can be understood as making an implicit claim on others to recognize their justification or rightness. This is what he [Hegel] means by saying that action has a necessary reference to the will of others. (104).

In this sense, Hegel's theory of action is inherently social, and not merely inherently normative. But for Alznauer, in contrast to Pippin, how others respond to these claims is no longer constitutive of the actions.

And given the necessity of a state for any normative order to exist, for any determination of right to have reached actuality, "the relevant 'others' are not all human beings, but only the agent's fellow citizens, those who are consciously subject to the same norms. An action claims to be justified, then, only for a given nation at a given time." (104). This move by Alznauer (a kind of "justificatory nationalism" to coin a term) is by no means necessary: one could think that anyone in the know of the relevant norms can judge whether the action is justified or not, the relevant judge need not be bound by the same norms themselves. Perhaps the idea is that they are not in a normative position to complain, only insiders are.

Alznauer's view is that whenever responsible agents act, their actions make a claim to be justified. "In the case of murder, for example, Hegel says it is the action itself that recognizes the universal that it is permissible to deceive or kill someone." (106). The justification, claims Alznauer, can then be of four different kinds, related to abstract right, morality, ethical life or world history. Although Hegel discusses action explicitly in the Morality-section of PR, Alznauer argues that all these four concern separate aspects of action and separate ways of justifying action. They represent gradually richer aspects of "mineness", "relation to the concept" and "reference to the will of others". (In PR §113 Hegel characterizes especially abstract right and morality in these terms.).

In some sense human action must indeed be relevant in all these four contexts. Alznauer does not however consider what may have led Hegel to discuss action precisely in the moral context: in that context the relationship between agent's intentions and deeds is relevant for moral praiseworthiness. By contrast, the relevant level of generality is different in ethical life: what matters are general patterns of customs, social practices, institutions and roles, less than the individual praise- or blameworthiness of individual roleholders. But it is an interesting idea to think through what, in the context of abstract right on the one hand, and ethical life and world history on the other hand, is added to the structure of responsible action, whose home territory is the moral viewpoint.

There is however a "developmental" challenge in describing these aspects of action from the four viewpoints: whereas abstract right only concerns the external dimension (permissibility in light of external constraints based on roughly property rights), morality concerns both dimensions: the external (moral permissibility of the deed) and the internal (the moral worth of intentions and motivations). The challenge then is whether the external dimension remains the same in moving from abstract right to morality. Often Alznauer seems to neglect this developmental aspect and writes as if later viewpoints would leave the earlier viewpoints as they are, unsuperseded. It could be that morality adds only the inner dimension, but that would not enable us to make sense of clashes between legal and moral permissibility and rights which Alznauer thinks are there (e.g. in the case where someone refuses to hand his tools to creditors, "insofar as his refusal is based on his right to preserve his own livelihood or welfare, it is morally justified", p. 119). It seems clear there are moral wrongs such as "intentionally misleading someone by telling the truth", which are not wrong in terms of abstract right (the speaker tells the truth, after all), but are morally wrong (the intention is to mislead). Alznauer does note a normative challenge at p.118, in discussing the possible collisions of the four perspectives, and the question of which perspectives overrides which -- but he fails to notice that what I call the developmental challenge concerns already describing action from the four perspectives.

Some of Alznauer's detailed suggestions within the general scheme are less successful. For example, he suggests that abstract right has to do with permissions and rights, and morality with positive requirements and obligations. But surely abstract right also poses the obligation not to violate other people's rights (see PR§113A), and something not being morally impermissible makes it morally permissible. So it seems rather that what is at stake is a different package of permissions and requirements, obligations and rights, in the context of abstract right and of morality. The same goes for ethical life, with my station and its duties, liberties, and ends constitutive of various roles such as being a father or a factory worker.

If there is a developmental challenge in describing how aspects of action develop from one perspective to another, in chapter four there is further an explicitly "dialectical" challenge that Alznauer meets head-on. The challenge, to repeat, is that for Hegel, on the one hand, we are responsible for everything we do, and on the other hand, we are responsible only for those aspects of the deed that we intended or foresaw.

Alznauer tries to tackle this paradox -- ultimately unsuccessfully -- with reference to Hegel's "inner-outer thesis". That is a general metaphysical doctrine that there is nothing in the inner essence that is not manifested externally, and vice versa. Hegel famously illustrates that thesis in the context of action, stating that the way humans are externally in their actions is how they are internally: someone who is only internally virtuous or moral but not in actions, is internally as "hollow and empty" as the actions are.

But the doctrine itself is clearly meant, like the doctrine that "everything that is rational is actual, and everything that is actual is rational", to apply for the best cases. It is not meant to deny that there are indeed cases in existence which are not rational, or cases of merely apparently virtuous agents who are indeed "hollow and empty". One should be more cautious in reading Hegel to suggest that the inner and the outer are identical in every case, such as all individual actions. Perhaps overall, a person's dispositions are revealed in the habitual participation in ethical life, and over a long period, one is what one does -- but prima facie one should not expect the doctrine to apply to each individual action, whereas questions of praise- and blameworthiness do arise in those contexts. But that is what Alznauer does in chapter four, and the nagging suspicion that the whole approach to the problem is a bit misstated remains throughout the chapter. By contrast, Alznauer's idea that the onesidedness of both abstract right and morality are overcome only in the context of ethical life seems well motivated.

Alznauer notes that Hegel uses different terms for our minimal sort of responsibility (Schuld) for the entire deed (Tat), consisting of all aspects of what we do, and more robust accountability (Zurechnungsfähigkeit) for those aspects that can be imputed to the agent, namely the action (Handlung). It remains unclear why Alznauer does not retain that distinction, but wants to collapse the senses of responsibility for whole deeds and intended aspects of action.

In this chapter Alznauer seems to operate with three rival definitions of a deed (Tat) and action (Handlung). He first characterizes the categories of deed and action as mutually exclusive (126): a deed meets the external requirement (being done by the agent) without meeting the internal requirement (being intended or foreseen by the agent), and an action meets both the internal and the external requirement. Nothing can be both a deed and an action: if it meets the internal requirement it is the latter but if not it is the former. This "rough" initial characterization may be a slip, as the second characterization is different: deed and action are two different ways of viewing the same act-event: the former "abstracts from the agent's internal intentions" and the latter doesn't. To call something a deed is to remain non-committal on whether it was intended or foreseen or not: it is not to commit to the view that it was not. Thirdly, he holds that the deed is the same as "legal action", the act-event "from the viewpoint of the requirements of abstract right" (132) whereas action is the act-event from the viewpoint of morality. The relevant sense of responsibility for deeds then is "answerability in a broadly legal sense" (132). Note that this definition of "deeds" makes it impossible for actions to be the willed and known aspects of deeds (a characterization Alznauer quotes from Hegel at p.139) -- actions are strictly speaking aspects of the act-event and not aspects of deeds. (A deed-description, say "stealing medicine from the drug store" does not say anything about the intention, so unless the deed is the whole act-event and not the act-event as described in its characteristics relevant for legal responsibility, it simply does not have the intention as its aspect. That is, action cannot be an aspect of deed.)

The argument that these two aspects then turn out to be identical in the contexts of ethical life will first require showing that there even is a conflict between being responsible in one sense for our deeds and in another sense for our actions, and then overcoming that conflict. The key to the solution in Alznauer's view is to hold that each member of a society in fact knows and wills what a reasonable agent in that society would have willed and known (165). This, as such, is an interesting claim worth developing further.


Chapter Five then turns to the context of world history. The crucial thing is that the world-historical significance of actions can be known only retrospectively, not in light of the standards of the prevailing ethical life. Let me just make one observation about the relation between ethical life and world history in these chapters: The image of ethical life is pretty static, and change is conceptualized only from the viewpoint of the world history. Alznauer does note that when the ethical life becomes "hollow, spiritless, and unsettled" it may be right to reject the customary standards and retreat to one's subjective sense of right and wrong, or in exceptional cases make a revolution. Any dynamic evolution of social life is not part of the picture.

Overall, Alznauer's book is rewardingly systematic, although chapter four is written in slightly different gear. The book manages to articulate a new position on Hegel's theory of action and agency. It did not convince this reader on all points, but it is a worthy addition to the thriving literature on Hegel and philosophy of action.

[1] [PR], Elements of the Philosophy of Right, edited by Allen W. Wood, translated by H.B. Nisbet, Cambridge University Press, 1991.