Heidegger: A (Very) Critical Introduction

Placeholder book cover

S. J. McGrath, Heidegger: A (Very) Critical Introduction, Eerdmans, 2008, 131pp., $16.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802860071.

Reviewed by Charles Guignon, University of South Florida


S. J. McGrath's trim little book offers us an overview of Heidegger's life-work, with special emphasis on his political activities and his relationship to theology. The book is part of a religious series originating from the Centre of Theology and Philosophy, and McGrath is up front in announcing that he is a Christian humanist and a personalist. Though he is highly impressed by Heidegger (this is his second book on the subject), his religious commitments incline him to be "very" critical of Heidegger. The book is divided into five chapters. After a short introduction, there are chapters on phenomenology, ontology, axiology, and theology, with a brief conclusion on "Why I Am Not a Heideggerian."

The chapters are of unequal quality and their titles do not really correspond to their subject matters. The chapter titled "Phenomenology" is actually about the early Heidegger, covering Heidegger's thought from his Habilitationsschrift of 1915 on Duns Scotus to his greatest work, Being and Time (1927). As a religious scholar, McGrath does not examine the debates on logic that motivated Heidegger's dissertation on psychologism of 1913, but he does a remarkably good job of explicating the Duns Scotus work and showing its relevance for all Heidegger's thought up to the magnum opus. This short chapter, only twenty-eight pages, provides a marvelously clear and thoughtful account of Heidegger's early thinking. McGrath is an excellent writer and his narrative is crisp, fresh and insightful. Instead of repeating the tired old clichés that make up so much of the Heidegger literature, he invents novel formulations and clear summaries of texts that illuminate Heidegger's work in interesting ways. With the exception of one important confusion about the texts, which I will turn to in a moment, this chapter provides a helpful and engaging summary of Heidegger's early work.

The chapter titled "Ontology" is actually an account of the later Heidegger. The strange juxtaposition of titles and chapter contents results from McGrath's misunderstanding of Heidegger's conception of phenomenology, which leads him to think that phenomenology is abandoned in the later works, whereas the term "ontology" correctly captures the intent of the later works, an idea Heidegger would reject. Nevertheless, this chapter contains some helpful, if not very original, elucidations of the later writings.

The chapters titled "Axiology" and "Theology," obviously McGrath's main interests, were rather disappointing in my view. The chapter on axiology repeats familiar criticisms of Heidegger for failing to provide an ethics to go along with his ontology. What this claim overlooks is Heidegger's critique of the then dominant "value philosophy." The term "value" that was introduced into philosophy in the nineteenth-century was borrowed from economic theory and therefore was loaded down with the assumptions of the science of economics. In line with his tendency to undercut counterproductive dichotomies, Heidegger rejected the dualism of fact and value and focused instead on formulating an account of our most "primordial" understanding of reality as "always already" suffused with what we today call "values." The conception of being as an "event" retrieves something like the older teleological understanding of reality as it is originally experienced by us, and it suggests that the modern distinction between factual and normative is derivative from this older experience of things. The axiology chapter also repeats the familiar charge that Heidegger was a "fascist" because he did not respect "liberal individualism," as though anyone who critically reflects on individualism is a fascist. The rather shrill, self-righteous tone of this chapter marks a strong contrast with the earlier, more temperate chapters.

Finally, the chapter on "Theology" continues the critique of Heidegger by claiming that his avowed "methodological atheism" fails to account for the fundamental need for God that is characteristic of all human experience everywhere. In this chapter, Heidegger's betrayal of his Christian roots is explained in terms of what McGrath thinks is a deep incoherence in Heidegger's thought -- the inseparability of the "ontic" and the "ontological" -- which should require Heidegger to make faith central to his "existential anthropology."

This "theological" criticism brings us to what McGrath thinks is the single greatest failing of Heidegger's life's work, his inability (in McGrath's view) to keep the ontic and the ontological separate. According to McGrath, "Heidegger's distinction between the ontological and the ontic is at best contrived, at worst, a strategy for advancing, without argument, questionable ethical, political, and theological positions. He himself cannot maintain the distinction but transgresses it repeatedly" (124). In my opinion, this criticism reveals a profound misunderstanding of Heidegger's intentions and methodology, especially those of the early writings. Nothing McGrath says suggests he has even the foggiest idea of what the terms "ontic" and "ontological" mean -- an appalling fact given the excellent secondary literature on the topic (literature he never cites).[1] The book would have been much better if he had been up on this literature.

To try to straighten this all out, we might survey Heidegger's detailed and careful accounts of phenomenology. Phenomenology -- for Heidegger, as well as for Husserl -- means "To the subject matter itself!" Where traditional philosophy engages in argument and counterargument within the framework of accepted conceptions inherited from the philosophical tradition, phenomenology attempts to actually look at and describe the subject matter under consideration in order to see the evidence and origins from which such conceptualizations spring. Its method might be summed up in Wittgenstein's famous injunction, "don't think, but look!" This requires starting out by considering the actual matters at issue in philosophical discussions and, where the traditional conceptualizations are found lacking, proposing new ways of talking about the topics.

Heidegger explicates the concepts of "ontic" and "ontological" through a consideration of science in section 3 of Being and Time. A field of study such as mathematics, for example, operates under normal conditions with a conception of the nature of its subject matter -- numbers or quantities -- that is taken as self-evident and beyond question by its practitioners. Mathematicians start from paradigm cases of numbers, presumably cardinal numbers. In the course of their work, however, they might encounter anomalous cases, such as zero, infinity, irrational numbers, negative numbers, three divided by zero, and so forth. When such anomalies arise, it becomes necessary to ask questions such as, "What are we talking about when we talk about numbers?" and "What exactly is a number?" For Heidegger, the ordinary busy-work of puzzle-solving in mathematics is called "ontic" inquiry, whereas deeper questions about the very nature of the subject matter of this domain are called "ontological."

Heidegger suggests that the various regional sciences (e.g., physics, literary theory, epistemology, historiography, etc.) will have a basis for engaging in ontological reflection about the entities they study only if they first engage in a study of "ontology in the widest sense," an inquiry into the being of anything whatsoever (BT section 3). An inquiry of this sort will require an even more basic investigation, an inquiry into the meaning of being, where this refers to the attempt to clarify the frame of reference or "space of meaning" in virtue of which anything whatsoever can become accessible or intelligible to us. Moreover, since we are the only entities who have an understanding of being, we will need to work out an account of human existence insofar as humans can have some understanding of being. The question of fundamental ontology that makes up the published portions of Being and Time therefore begins with an inquiry into how "being in general becomes intelligible" (BT section 45) and this in turn calls for an inquiry into the being of Dasein, where the term "Dasein" means humans insofar as their pre-ontological understanding is a condition for the possibility of anything showing up as intelligible, that is to say, as counting or mattering in some way. It asks, in Thomas Sheehan's nice formulation, "How come being?"[2] From the fact that the question is solely about the conditions of intelligibility, it should be evident that Heidegger is interested neither in an armchair "anthropology" nor in an account of personhood, though his examination may have consequences for such inquiries.

Dasein, as the "clearing" or "disclosedness" in virtue of which entities can emerge into presence as such-and-such, is originally thought of neither as an individual nor as a collective. What is important about "the being of the there" (Da-sein) is that it embodies a pre-understanding of what things are all about. Because it is the locus of meaning that allows anything to be intelligible or meaningful, it is a likely "ontic" place to start a phenomenological description of the being of entities generally, the "ontological" investigation. Heidegger stipulates that the "ontic" traits of humans are to be called "existentiell" and the "ontological" structures discovered by the description are to be designated as "existential." Thus, he can say that "the roots of the existential analytic … are ultimately existentiell, that is, ontical" (BT section 4). Since we are the entities to be examined, we must start from where we are, that is, from our own undertaking of philosophizing. And insofar as posing the question of being (asking "What is this all about?") is an essential tendency-of-being of humans generally (the entities who care about what it is to be), "the question of being is nothing other than a radicalization of an essential tendency-of-being which belongs to Dasein itself," namely, trying to get clear about our basic understanding of being as it shows up for us when we are doing philosophy (ibid).

Heidegger is fully aware that the project so described is fraught with problems. For one thing, there is Plato's question of how to begin the investigation, in other words, the question about how are we to search for something (like the meaning of being) if we do not already know in advance what it is we are seeking (BT section 2). Heidegger deals with this puzzle by suggesting that all of us always have some prior sense of "what it is to be" by virtue of the fact that we are "proximally and for the most part" involved in worldly affairs in such a way that we have some prior know-how of what things are all about. This shared background of understanding is made accessible through our enculturation into the communal historical and cultural context that Heidegger calls the "they" or the "anyone" (das Man).

As his descriptions show, however, this everyday understanding as a rule is shot through with one-sidedness and distortions. For this reason we need to diagnose the understanding we absorb from the they (often by recalling older understandings of things, including those sedimented in our religious traditions). And we need to clarify what Dasein is when it is whole and focused rather than dispersed and muddled in the turmoil of everydayness. This leads in Division II of the book to the examination of Dasein's "ownness" or most "real" way of being (the German word "eigentlich" in fact could not mean "authentic" for a German speaker; the word is colloquially used to ask "Really?" though Heidegger's etymology emphasizes the idea of what is most "proper" (eigen)). The final view is that although all understandings of being are derived from the communal context, to be "really" Dasein is to take these over and make them one's own as a self-responsible and self-determining individual (as Kant had argued). The ethic of responsibility and commitment that emerges is clearly "elitist" in the sense that not everyone will be willing to achieve it. But insofar as it always emphasizes our indebtedness to our context ("thrownness," "guilt," "heritage"), becoming one's "own" self engages the individual more intensely in the social and historical context of the "they" (the concrete "world-historical Situation").

The aim of this long exposition of Heidegger's project and method is to respond to some of McGrath's criticisms. It is not hard to see why Being and Time starts from a description of human existence as the source of the "unconcealedness" (a literal translation of the Greek word for truth, aletheia) for entities generally. It is also not hard to see why Heidegger constantly moves back and forth between attempts to clarify the subject matter of his investigation (ontology) and concrete descriptions or "attestations" of that subject matter (the ontic or existentiell). This back-and-forth movement is called "the hermeneutic circle". The investigation must bracket the uncritical assumptions of specialized sciences (such as axiology and theology) because its overarching goal is to provide a basis for arriving at a way of grounding such regional sciences in an unbiased understanding of what it is to be. McGrath treats Heidegger unfairly by overlooking his explicit accounts of his project and methodology, with the result that his "(very) critical introduction" to Heidegger is not so much an interpretation as a hatchet job.

[1] These distinctions are made clearly in H. L. Dreyfus' classic work, Being-in-the-World: A Commentary on Heidegger's Being and Time, Division 1, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1991, p. 20.

[2] Thomas Sheehan, "Reading a Life: Heidegger and Hard Times," in The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger, 2nd edn., Charles Guignon, ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006): 70-96.