Heidegger and Language

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Jeffrey Powell (ed.), Heidegger and Language, Indiana University Press, 2013, 287pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253007483.

Reviewed by R. Matthew Shockey, Indiana University South Bend


This is a collection of fourteen essays organized more-or-less chronologically around Heidegger's writings on language from the mid-1920s (circa Being and Time (1927)) to the end of his career. The first two, by Daniel Dahlstrom ("Heidegger's Ontological Analysis of Language") and Walter Brogan ("Listening to the Silence: Reticence and the Call of Conscience in Heidegger's Philosophy"), deal primarily with Being and Time. The next two, by William McNeill ("In Force of Language: Language and Desire in Heidegger's Reading of Aristotle's Metaphysics Θ") and Richard Polt ("The Secret Homeland of Speech: Heidegger on Language, 1933-1934"), look at Heidegger's work of the early 1930s when he is beginning to break away from his transcendental-phenomenological investigation of being and the emphasis there on the communicative, practical, tool-like character of language, as well as other "metaphysical" theories that treat language as a system of signs corresponding to distinct signifieds. John Sallis ("The Logic of Thinking") then presents, after a refresher on Husserl's philosophy of logic, a succinct overview of four courses on logic Heidegger gave from the mid-20s to mid-30s, during which he progressively moved away from Husserl.

The remainder of the essays deal primarily (though not exclusively) with Heidegger's work from the mid-30s and beyond, when he sought to develop a new, anti-metaphysical (but no less fundamental) thinking of being and the way such thinking comes into language. These include essays by Krzysztof Ziarek ("Giving Its Word: Event (as) Language"), Daniela Vallega-Neu ("Heidegger's Poietic Writings: From Contributions to Philosophy to Das Ereignis"), Robert Bernasconi ("Poets as Prophets and as Painters: Heidegger's Turn to Language and the Hölderlinian Turn in Context"), Dennis J. Schmidt ("Truth Be Told: Homer, Plato, and Heidegger"), Jeffrey L. Powell ("The Way to Heidegger's 'Way to Language'"), David Farrell Krell ("Is There a Heidegger -- or, for That Matter, a Lacan -- Beyond All Gathering?"), Françoise Dastur ("Heidegger and the Question of the 'Essence' of Language"), Peter Hanly ("Dark Celebration: Heidegger's Silent Music"), and Christopher Fynsk ("Heidegger with Blanchot: On the Way to Fragmentation").

These essays seem to be oriented towards readers who are relatively new to or only somewhat familiar with Heidegger's work. That's not to say they are easy reads -- Heidegger deliberately makes it impossible to write anything easily digestible about him -- only that there is a lot of exposition and summarizing, little positioning of claims made relative to other secondary literature (and almost none to work in philosophy of language that does not draw on Heidegger), and not a lot of critical engagement with what is exposited (there is a nearly universal acceptance of the later Heidegger's creative but highly problematic leveling of virtually the entire history of post-Socratic Western philosophy and all its internal richness and complexity into just "metaphysics"). The essays are, however, when taken together, helpful and often illuminating of Heidegger, if only in demonstrating just how difficult exposition of his views of language is and why, by his lights, that must be the case. They do also manage, to varying degrees, to show where there is something of abiding philosophical interest in his work on language. In what follows I touch on eight of the fourteen essays to try to give some sense of this. The other six all are worth reading -- Dastur's provides a particularly nice overview of the arc of Heidegger's thought from early to late -- but I leave consideration of them aside for reasons of space.

Brogan's essay offers a clear presentation of Heidegger's discussion in Being and Time of conscience as a form of discourse (Rede). He brings out the salient features of the call of conscience as a silent or secretive call that both comes from and over oneself, and he suggests that even though it calls one back from lostness in the public world to one's own freedom, this is an experience that grounds what he calls "mortal community" with other free beings. As we see from later essays, and the last third of Brogan's, much of Heidegger's later thought develops the idea prefigured here of being speaking to or through us out of a primordial silence or stillness, though Heidegger moves away from the subjectivism implied in Being and Time's locating this in an individual's conscience. Brogan's piece also reminds us that already present in Heidegger's early work is a version of his later view that to hear and speak of being requires a fundamental transformation of the hearer-speaker away from the already available public language and philosophical theories of it, and Brogan rightly recognizes that the transformation in Being and Time is a version of the Platonic (really neo-Platonic/Augustinian) turning away from one's lostness in the world back to oneself, in whose being one can discern the forms of being as such -- a point I will return to at the end.

McNeill's essay looks at the Summer 1931 lecture course on Aristotle's Metaphysics Θ, in which Heidegger gives a reading of Aristotle's concept of force, dunamis (translated by Heidegger as Kraft), as a fundamental, singular ground of the intelligibility of that which, while one, is nevertheless not simple. It has an internal structure that involves essentially irreducible moments; and it is (thus) manifest always in multiple ways (in different kinds of being), and each of these ways in multiple particular beings. After sketching these general ideas, McNeill focuses on "technÄ“ as a dunamis meta logou: a force that occurs through and as logos" (51). He shows how Heidegger finds in both speaking and producing a desire-driven process that reveals itself in its unity in the pursuit of its end, and that this pursuit involves an implicit drawing together of all the non-realized ends, and the non-chosen ways to the end that is pursued. Thus what is not is determinate, and it is the necessary accompaniment to the speaking and producing of what is. McNeill indicates -- though I wish he had said more, for it is a suggestive idea -- that this provides the basis for explaining the primary sense in which we "have" logos and so are "logical." The clarity and philosophical richness of this essay reflects the fact that Heidegger was often at his own philosophical best in his lecture courses on other philosophers; and it makes clear the need to look more closely at the work from this crucial yet under-explored period in Heidegger's thought (when Kant and German Idealism were also central preoccupations).

Returning to the idea of silence: as Brogan had already begun to show, by the early thirties, Heidegger had come to think that what is said must emerge from the unsaid, and that authentic or genuine speech must attend to the unsaid, not just listen in to what is already articulated in language. Polt looks at this idea in relation to Heidegger's view that a people is bound together as a people through shared language, and that a fully realized people is one in which each person is attuned inwardly to the silent origin of their shared language. This makes for a clear link -- clearer than some of us would like -- between Heidegger's philosophy and his disastrous support of National Socialism as a nationalistic movement. Polt rightly criticizes Heidegger for thinking that this idea of shared attunement to silence can provide an adequate conception of the political, for it fails to recognize that political unity is in fact created by the acts of speaking in public space in which speakers articulate their commitments and recognize each other as speakers undertaking those commitments. But Polt is no anti-Heidegger polemicist, and his essay illustrates well how one may try to preserve the philosophy without simply ignoring the man.

Ziarek's essay elucidates Heidegger's view that (in Ziarek's words) we must "transfor[m] . . .  our relation to language beyond its metaphysical parameters" (103), for only then will we be able to experience the singular and non-repeatable "event" (Ereignis) of being giving itself in word without trying to force this event into a systematic metaphysics that hides its essential singularity and non-repeatability. While Ziarek's essay attempts, and so suffers from, the impossible task of giving a clear exposition of work that is essentially designed to be unexpositable, it does offer helpful reflection on what Heidegger is doing with his philosophical language and why it is so frustratingly difficult.

Ziarek takes Heidegger's etymological excursions, frequent hyphenating of words, and constant playing of related terms off one another all as aspects of his attempt to shake us out of our metaphysical mindset -- and so transform us -- by calling attention to the words themselves in ways that help free us from thinking of words simply as universal signifiers of things, as metaphysics (according to Heidegger) inevitably does. Much of the interest of Ziarek's essay stems from his acknowledgement of the problem that arises of whether "Heidegger's texts . . . contravene the very transformation his thought is trying to evince" (115). For it seems that we can't but come across his words as signs of some universal form, or at least repeatable experience, and so as something that we each may take up and find the meaning of. Heidegger's problems actually run deeper than Ziarek acknowledges, however, for the fact remains that he is also insistently after a singular, basic vocabulary, a way of describing the event of being, that which any and every moment of being there in the world grasped as meaningful shares. This is essentially the problem that (as Vallega-Neu and Krell note in their essays), Derrida made central in his own engagement with Heidegger.

Vallega-Neu's essay fits well with Ziarek's and offers further valuable reflection on the difficulty of reading Heidegger's "poeitic" (i.e., linguistically productive and thus revelatory) works of the late 30s and early 40s, works which, she says, "we may think of . . . as meditative exercises, thought experiments, notes, and/or sketches for future elaborations" (119-20). She notes the temptation to "psychologize" Heidegger by seeing him as just "encircl[ing] himself into a solitary space of thought, a space that -- although daring in its own pursuits -- kept him safe from the madness of a world" (139) -- a temptation I find myself, as generally a fan of his earlier, transcendental work, all too inclined to give in to -- and to see something profound in his attempt to think language and being anew by reworking the inherited language of the metaphysical tradition so as to turn it against itself.

But how to respond to that attempt, without just falling back into the very metaphysics Heidegger is trying to free us from? Krell's essay offers us one sort of answer. It is perhaps best described as a performance occasioned by Heidegger's Logos essay of 1951 and Lacan's translation of it. Krell's essay is focused on the problem (noted above as that of the desire for a single language of being) of Heidegger's never-ceasing drive for singularity and unity in the face of diversity and multiplicity -- as Krell rightly says (hearkening back to the Platonic transformation Brogan associates with the method of Being and Time), "Heidegger's bête noire is dispersion, Zerstreuung, and his principal remedy for it is gathering, assembling, encompassing within a One whatever threatens to disperse and scatter" (212). While walking us through Heidegger's essay, Krell himself cavorts through languages, events, and ideas, scattering "meaningful" links among them, but in the process exhibiting the richness of linguistic meaning in a way that deliberately resists being gathered into a One, a thesis or otherwise singular meaning.  He thus demonstrates something of what Heidegger might be seen as having been trying to point us towards with his own rich linguistic play, and against his own anti-dispersive drive. But unlike anything Heidegger ever wrote, Krell's essay is fun, joyful even -- it delights in language and brings its readers along in that delight. It implicitly brings out how, for all of his play with language, Heidegger (and most of us who write about him -- indeed most philosophers writing at all) is always and entirely serious, not playful at all.

Hanly's essay stands squarely with Heidegger on the side of seriousness -- language comes from pain, we learn -- but it is nevertheless one of the most adventurous essays in the volume. Hanly begins by acknowledging that Heidegger said very little directly about music, and yet he makes a pretty good case that consideration of music pervades and deeply informs Heidegger's work. Looking principally at Heidegger's discussion of poetry by Stefan George and Georg Trakl, and tying this to his larger project of overcoming the ("metaphysical") conception of language as a system of signs of things and of speaking as the expression in signs of subjective states, Hanly shows how an understanding of song and singing, of rhythm, and of sound shapes Heidegger's mature view of poetic language as an articulation of words that preserves the stillness or silence out of which the words emerge. Hanly suggests at the end that what we think of as music is itself grounded in language as Heidegger came to understand it. I'm not so sure about this, but even if we don't learn anything deep about music from this essay, it is one of the few in the volume that breaks new ground in our understanding of Heidegger and the sources or inspirations of his thought.

Taken together, these essays all show Heidegger's attempts to wrestle with the limits of language and to bring to language its primordial origin or ground, which, by his own telling, always resists and conceals itself in any such attempt. Heidegger may thus, as Dastur says, reject Augustinian nominalism (as described by Wittgenstein), but he is nevertheless faced with precisely the task of the Augustinian teacher, who must seek to find words that, though they cannot simply tell the student about being, may yet help effect a transformation in the student towards an original understanding of being. As Ziarek observes, however, in the end "the transformation" in our relation to language and being that Heidegger seeks "cannot be compelled or manufactured. In short, it is not up to human doing" (117). Heidegger's being and Augustine's (which for him is, of course, God) must each come to us if we are to be saved -- from, respectively, "metaphysics" and original sin, which don't seem so different, given Heidegger's aforementioned seriousness. Ziarek's observation continues: "However, [the transformation] does require human preparation, and it is in this sense that Heidegger conceives of his thinking as preparatory" (117). The essays in this volume may not themselves offer us the transformation or salvation Heidegger sought, but they do on the whole contribute to his preparatory project, providing worthwhile reading for anyone coming to Heidegger's work on language for the first time, and some help for those who have been thinking about, with, or against him already.