Heidegger and Marcuse: The Catastrophe and Redemption of History

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Andrew Feenberg, Heidegger and Marcuse: The Catastrophe and Redemption of History, Routledge, 2005, 176 pp, $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415941784

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom , Boston University


The aim of this intriguing study is to demonstrate the importance of Heidegger's early work for Marcuse's thinking, early and late ("even against Marcuse's explicit self-understanding"), and, more importantly, to project its undeveloped promise as a philosophy of technology. Feenberg argues that "Marcuse remained true at some level to an earlier Heidegger the later Heidegger rejected and concealed" (xiv). Marcuse, we are told, shared the early Heidegger's "crucial conviction that the notion of being is modeled on productive activity in Greek thought and the thought of Aristotle in particular" (85). Opening chapters on the Greek understanding of techne and Heidegger's early and later reflections on techne and technology give way to four chapters recounting Marcuse's early work on Hegel and later works on Freud and aesthetics, but always with the purpose of demonstrating the persisting valence of that "crucial conviction." The result is a lucid and forceful argument for retrieving Heidegger's early interpretation of the Greek understanding of techne for the purpose of developing the unrealized potential of Marcuse's thinking as the prototype of a needed phenomenological Marxist approach to technology in the present. The argument is not above reproach in my view and, following a review of the contents of the chapters, I offer a few criticisms by way of conclusion.

According to Feenberg, Heidegger and Marcuse agree that "the source of the uniqueness and tragedy of modernity" is the value-free or neutral character of technology or, equivalently, "the obliteration of humanity's special status and dignity as the being through which the world takes on intelligibility and meaning" (2). The agreement stems from a perception of the alleged difference between the constructive character of Greek techne and the destructive character of modern technology. The first chapter of the book accordingly elaborates that Greek understanding of techne. Instead of recounting Heidegger's interpretation, Feenberg usefully takes his bearings for the Greek outlook on techne from Plato's Gorgias, before noting the modern despair (shared by Weber and the Frankfurt School) at recovering that outlook. Feenberg then sketches how Heidegger's distinctive interpretation of techne as revealing "an original unity underlying the dichotomies of objectivistic thinking" sets the stage for Marcuse's developing views on technology.

In chapter two Feenberg turns to Heidegger's essay on technology and his application of Hölderlin's enigmatic observation "But where danger is, grows also what saves" to technological enframing. Attempting to translate Heidegger's idiom into more comprehensible terms, Feenberg observes that "it would be more natural to express Heidegger's point by saying that today we know that meanings are culturally relative and that this knowledge poses for us the problem of what is ultimately real beyond the bounds of any particular culture" (23). 'Being' is Heidegger's term for culture, understood as something that "reveals itself in our encounter with our world and thus we are indeed implicated in the granting but not as the creating subject that commands a passive reality" (24). On Feenberg's gloss, what saves is the realization that our technological culture is only one way in which being dispenses itself and, like all such ways, one that conceals much of itself in the way that it reveals itself. The path to those concealed, "saving" possibilities is the "history of being" that dominates Heidegger's later thinking, a history that begins with the Greeks and, most notably, the ontological (noninstrumental) conception of the essence of techne. This conception is external to modernity and informs Heidegger's approach to Dasein in Being and Time as well as his later approach to technology. It also helps explain, Feenberg submits, the focus on ontology in "The Question Concerning Technology." Against this backdrop, he devotes the bulk of chapter two to "the key concepts of this ontology as they were first formulated by Aristotle" (28). The rambling account of these concepts draws upon Heidegger's treatments of them, as Feenberg maintains that "until the mid-1930s" Heidegger had a primarily positive view of the productionist metaphysics implied by those concepts (36). Indeed, with their appreciation of the way beings reveal themselves, "the Greeks discovered the basic premises of Heidegger's philosophy" (38). At the same time, acknowledging Heidegger's appreciation for the ungrounded nature of that revealing, Feenberg concludes the chapter with a précis of "Heidegger's Dilemma": his inability to offer anything more than "the remote eschatological hope that art can recover the power of revealing or that the very extremity of enframing will lead to its collapse" (43). The dilemma, Feenberg contends, suggests a Hegelian alternative or, better, a Marxist version of a Hegelian alternative pursued by Marcuse whereby the insights of antiquity and modernity might be reconciled in a post-historical self-consciousness.

The focus of the third chapter ("The Dialectic of Life: Marcuse's Hegel") is Marcuse's thesis, Hegel's Ontology and the Theory of Historicity, submitted to Heidegger in 1930. This chapter contains an admirably clear, at times critical, review of the thesis. By means of this review Feenberg demonstrates the considerable extent to which the Aristotelian production model of being, retrieved by Heidegger, informs Marcuse's account of Hegel's historical dialectic, albeit only up to a point. That point is where Marcuse turns in a direction opened up by Marx and further elaborated by Lukacs. Marcuse interprets Hegel's dialectic as an account of being producing itself, a process involving its manifestation to human beings. The nature of this manifestation iterates the Aristotelian notion, recapitulated in Heidegger's existential analysis, that the essences of things are revealed in a techne. Despite Heidegger's influence on this reading of Hegel, Marcuse follows Hegel and not Heidegger in seeing in labor the possibility of overcoming the contingency and alienation pervading Dasein's relation to the world (52). This careful reconstruction of Marcuse's reading of Hegel's ontology thus sets the stage for the demonstration in chapter four ("Interlude with Lukacs: Totality and Revolution") of the importance of Lukacs' thinking for Marcuse but again, only up to a critical point. That critical point is Lukacs' allegedly rigid divorce of history from nature, the unhappy consequences of which Marcuse supposedly avoids, not only by turning to Freud and aesthetics, but by extending the dialectic to technology. This extension pays dividends, Feenberg contends, precisely because it recovers the Aristotelian model of techne, as interpreted by the early Heidegger.

In chapter five ("Aesthetic Redemption") Feenberg turns to a conviction driving the later Marcuse: with the collapse of the revolutionary proletarian consciousness, the opposition to the reifications of modern technological rationality must emerge from another source, namely, an aesthetically transformed experience. Feenberg understands Marcuse's work on Freud in this sense; life instincts can triumph over dominant forms of the death instinct through institutional and technological transformations rooted in the aesthetic sphere, grounded in eros. In an effort to explain what this transformation means for technology, Feenberg reviews Marcuse's "innovative" but ambiguous concept of technological rationality. Given the "Marcusian enigma," i.e., the fact that transformation cannot be based on completely new technical principles and cannot be a mere change of goals, Feenberg proposes a deflationary but realistic interpretation according to which "his concept of technological rationality cannot be identical with the formal concepts of efficiency and control, but must have a content as a socially specific pattern of goal orientation" (100). Feenberg provides an illuminating outline of how Marcuse's thinking contributes to contemporary technology studies, especially via Feenberg's notion of "technical codes" which give concrete content to Marcuse's general contention that "life affirming values are actually internal to technology" (105). As to what the "affirmation of life" means more concretely, Feenberg "only sketch[es] some points for reflection" (106). Though criticizing a mere sketch would be unfair, it raises questions. For instance, hearkening back once again to Heidegger's interpretation of the Greek techne, he speaks repeatedly here, as elsewhere, of a harmony between human beings and nature, "harmonies that appear most obviously in the aesthetic relation to nature" (107). But what precisely does this harmony mean and why should we think that aesthetics (the aesthetics of Disney or hip-hop, high modern or postmodern) provides a key to it? Feenberg cites a difference between violating and disturbing nature, claiming that "from the standpoint of Marcuse's theory, a criterion based on the affirmation of life distinguishes these responses" (108). But it is hard to see how this talk of the affirmation of life is not yet another promissory note. Does the affirmation of life tells us -- to name just a few examples -- not to eat meat, not to abort fetuses, not to develop transcontinental pipelines, not to develop atomic energy? By itself the notion of affirmation of life is inadequate to answer these questions. Nor does the elaboration of Marcuse's "fourfold," as we might dub his account of goods and their specific privations, suggest a way to answer this inadequacy.

In the sixth chapter ("The Question Concerning Nature") Feenberg returns to his central thesis, as he argues that Marcuse's late philosophy, precisely as it concerns technological, scientific, and phenomenological concepts of nature, both recollects and represses basic Heideggerian themes. Recognizing that Marcuse's conception of an aestheticized technological rationality can only be sustained by a suitable conception of nature, a conception other than the natural sciences' concept of an objectified nature, Feenberg contends that Heidegger's recovery of Greek techne in his account of being-in-the-world provides Marcuse with the resources to develop that conception. Feenberg attributes Marcuse's failed attempts in this regard to his reliance on the objectivistic (nonexistential) approaches of Marx and Freud. "The result is an incoherent attempt to transcend the opposition of biology and history from an objectivistic standpoint that supposes their separation" (122). Yet Feenberg contends that the unmistakable phenomenological roots of Marcuse's late work also provide the key to the wanted conception of nature. What is necessary in this connection, Feenberg maintains, is a differentiation of natural scientific abstractions from concrete technical disciplines. "These disciplines respond to both the nature of lived experience and scientific nature, merging them seamlessly in a practical unity that guides action. In so doing, they embody social forces in technically valid form" (132).

The expression "technically valid form" in this last remark is unclear to me. More importantly, the remark promises a resolution of what Feenberg himself otherwise calls an "irresolvable duality between experience and objectivity," a duality that reflects phenomenology's proposal of "a kind of double truth," i.e., that of lived experience and that of science (131f). The final pages of Feenberg's study thus give mixed, if not contradictory signals. On the one hand, his plea for taking a second look at Marcuse turns precisely on appreciating the possibilities of "an explicit phenomenological Marxism," one that presumably entails phenomenology's "methodological dualism." On the other hand, he affirms the possibility of an understanding and execution of concrete technical disciplines that resolve the poles of that dualism, indeed, "seamlessly". Interpreting the promise of Marcuse's work, he writes: "The underlying totality of human beings and things the Greeks discovered in the objective structure of the world now depends on the human being as the principle of world creation" (136). The practical realization of this totality is a matter of a "new technology based on aesthetically informed sensations [that] would respect humans and nature rather than destroying them" (137).

This affirmation corresponds to a nostalgic longing for harmony pervading the study. Feenberg apparently subscribes to the notion that the Greek world, for all its subjugations and "narrowness" from a modern perspective, is in some sense "the lost Eden of reason" (136; see also 87f). The notion is fortified by what he takes to be Heidegger's appropriation of Greek techne. But this interpretation of Heidegger strikes me as ill advised. Though Heidegger contrasts Greek and modern views of technology, it would be wrong to infer that he thereby endorses the Greek view or takes from the Greeks "his own theory in Being and Time according to which everyday instrumental activity offers the basic access to reality" (5). The former inference is wrong because the aim of Heidegger's historical studies is destructive. In the early 1920s, it bears noting, Heidegger takes aim at the Greek influence on Christianity. Calling himself a Christian theologian at the time, he pleads for a Christianity "free of the Greek world" and, indeed, precisely because of the consequences of a productionist metaphysics for religion and the historicity of revelation. He regards those consequences as equally deleterious for philosophy. The early Heidegger, for all his respect for classical Greek thinkers, has fundamental misgivings about the quasi-pragmatic way they think of being, a key source of the Western forgottenness of being or, equivalently, its identification of being with presence. Moreover, while Heidegger emphasizes the manner in which everyday instrumental activity constitutes the overlooked supposition of theory, the second half of Being and Time amply testifies to the fact that he hardly considered such activity "the basic access to reality."

But far more important than issues of Heidegger-exegesis are two sets of problems of justification that beset Feenberg's stimulating study. I have already broached one set of these problems in the course of mentioning the mixed signals of the study's conclusion. This first set of problems emerges from the familiar corner that phenomenology seems to paint itself into when it affirms the irreducibility of a first-personal account of lived experience. As far as I can tell, the familiar claim that phenomenology is somehow more fundamental than science, that it understands something that science presupposes but cannot explain, is made but not justified. Moreover, thanks to the phenomenological reduction, the phenomenologist, Marxist or not, cuts herself off from any means of elaborating the relation and justifying the relative valence of the truths of her lived experience to those of science and, presumably, technology. I say "presumably" because Feenberg's contention is precisely that technology in some sense -- and not just "a revised concept of technology" or a "new technology" (see 132, 136f) -- reconciles the two truths. But at the very least more needs to be said to establish as much especially since it is not clear how a phenomenological understanding of technology, as proposed by Feenberg, does not duplicate the duality.

Earlier I mentioned my impression of a nostalgic longing for harmony informing Feenberg's study. The iteration of the term 'harmony' is perhaps telling, given its jointly aesthetic and ethical connotations, much like kalos, the Greeks' term for the beautiful and the fine. However, Feenberg's Marcuse and perhaps Feenberg himself propose a notion of the aesthetic dimension that displaces the ethical. Aesthetics and not ethics, we are told, "would support a constructive engagement with political and technical possibilities" (137; see, too, 89, 95, 97: "beauty is the symbol of the good"); the miracle of the New Left was "the emergence of a sensibility adequate to the real horror and possibilities" of the world at that historical juncture (138). Yet, as the construction of these sentences themselves suggest, aesthetic possibilities of the sort mentioned depend upon criteria of what is constructive and what is horrifying; it does not supply them.