Heidegger and Philosophical Atheology: A Neo-Scholastic Critique

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Peter S. Dillard, Heidegger and Philosophical Atheology: A Neo-Scholastic Critique, Continuum, 2008, 159pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847064516.

Reviewed by S. J. McGrath, Memorial University of Newfoundland



In a bloated Heidegger-industry Peter Dillard’s book is a welcome contribution to a small but significant sub-section of the secondary literature that examines Heidegger’s historical and systematic relationship to medieval philosophy. Dillard draws much needed attention to the Scotistic elements in Heidegger’s thought (for example the assumption of the univocity of being shared by Scotus and Heidegger), as well as Heidegger’s relationship to the medieval enterprise of “speculative grammar”. The substance of Dillard’s study is a carefully staged counter-attack on Heidegger’s critique of onto-theology. Dillard does not pretend to be a Heideggerian or any kind of post-metaphysical thinker. As the subtitle indicates, this is a brazenly ‘neo-Scholastic’ attack on Heidegger and the post-metaphysical movements he inspired (hermeneutics, deconstruction, post-metaphysical theology, etc.). If Heidegger is going to continue to be celebrated for bringing an end to onto-theology, Dillard convincingly argues that we would do well to consider the most sophisticated version of the onto-theological argument, Scotus’s.

Dillard focuses on Heidegger’s largely ignored 1916 ‘second dissertation’ or Habilitationsschrift, the Categories and Theory of Meaning of John Duns Scotus, and the 1962 lecture “Time and Being”, justifying this selection of texts on the grounds that he is not particularly interested in Heidegger’s development. The Habilitationsschrift has little to say about onto-theology, but serves to situate Heidegger in relationship to the medieval tradition. (He was once upon a time a Scotist.) “Time and Being” is one of Heidegger’s most cryptic elaborations of the notion of Ereignis (appropriation).

Dillard reads Ereignis as figure for an “ultimate contingency”, an uncaused and uncausable happening. The notion is tackled as possibly a “fatal counterexample to Scotus’s assumption that whatever is contingent must be causable” (p. 55). Approximated as “the event”, “enowning”, or “appropriating”, Ereignis is an untranslatable term. It connotes the happening — the rupture or opening — that holds within itself the secret of its happening and makes possible both Dasein and the appearance of beings dependent upon its “disclosedness” or openness (Erschlossenheit). It also connotes the appropriation of facticity or owning of one’s time, a task that belongs uniquely to Dasein. The difficulty with the term Ereignis is that it references two seemingly incompatible ideas: the notion of an event and the notion of appropriation. The former appears to be an objective happening, the latter a subjective act, something one does. The ambiguity is of course deliberate. Dasein’s owning of itself, which is the task for thinking and the only experience of truth available to us, is the event of history. Ereignis names that which is never unveiled to calculation, that which is repeatedly suppressed by the metaphysics of presence, namely, the unthinkable upsurge in the nothing that renders Dasein free and available for the showing of being.

To read appropriation as a figure for “ultimate contingency” is to transpose the later Heidegger into a scholastic disputatio that he cannot win. Appropriation becomes the denial of Scotus’s central premise, that everything contingent is, if not caused, at least causable. As “the objection” to the thesis of a first cause, Dillard states Heidegger’s ‘position’ as tersely and strongly as possible, only to demolish it by counter-arguments. Scotus’s argument relies on two premises: (1) that an infinite series of essentially ordered causes (i.e., causes that are responsible not only for the existence of an effect, but also for its nature or causal power) is impossible; (2) that God is a necessary being, a being, which, if existent, exists necessarily, not contingently. These are common stock in medieval theology. What’s unique in Scotus is the way they are elaborated and defended: “Something able to produce an effect is simply first, that is to say, it neither can be produced by an efficient cause nor does it exercise its efficient causality in virtue of anything other than itself”.1 Dillard draws out the originality of Scotus’s approach, which is easy for non-specialists to miss. Scotus does not begin with the actuality of the world, which is then reduced back to necessary being as its sufficient cause (the so-called cosmological argument). Nor is his proof entirely a priori, working with concepts independently of the existence of actual things to deduce the existence of necessary being (the ontological argument). Scotus starts with the empirical fact of possibility, or more accurately, contingency. This he understands, not as ‘that which depends on something else’, but as that which could be caused. It is not a priori true of the contingent that it depends on something else to exist; this remains to be proven. What is essential to the notion of the contingent is the possibility of causality by another. This distinction makes Scotus appealing to late modern metaphysicians, shaped as they are by quantum physics and the spectres of uncaused contingencies, which it generates. For Dillard, it also makes Scotus supremely relevant for Heidegger. If the contingent is essentially causable and cannot be thought otherwise, then a sheer happening, a ‘giving’ with no possible cause or giver, is impossible.

Proceeding by examining the conditions implicit in the notion of possibility, Dillard proves that an ultimate contingency is impossible. A series of possible causes cannot go on an ad infinitum, nor can the series of possible causes terminate in a cause that just happens to be. Imagine a series of all contingent causes. The question arises: could the series itself be caused? Assuming that it could be, we can ask: is the possible cause of the series itself contingent? If it were, it would be part of the series (for the series contains all contingent causes), therefore, a cause of itself, which is not possible. Nor could an ultimate contingency serve as a sufficient explanation of the existence of the series, for something that just happens explains nothing. Dillard writes,

The Heideggerian atheologian need not provide a complete comprehension of the nature of Appropriation. But he does need to provide a comprehension of Appropriation sufficient to understand how Its ‘sending’ can function in genuine noncausal explanation of being and time (p.62).

The most interesting part of this book is Dillard’s presentation of Scotus’s causal argument. If neither an infinite series of contingencies nor a first contingent cause is possible, then a first necessary being is possible. The next step is to prove that God could never be merely possible; he is either impossible or actual. The argument runs as follows. If God is possible he must be possible to cause. But as a necessary being God could not be caused to exist, for then he would not be necessary. Therefore the series of possible causes must terminate in an actually existing necessary being. However sophisticated the argument becomes, Scotus is not going to convince any Heideggerian, who will not get beyond the first premise, without crying ‘theoretical’, ‘ontic’, ‘metaphysical’, etc. More decisively, the Heideggerian will object that appropriation is not ‘an uncausable contingency’.

In my view, Dillard and Heidegger are not talking about the same thing. Appropriation is not the opposite of necessary being, not a challenge to Scotus’s causal argument, and therefore cannot be fed into a Scotistic disjunction. Heideggerian appropriation is not the denial of the possibility of necessary being, nor is the Scotistic affirmation of necessary being the denial of the possibility of appropriation. Appropriation is meant to make the contingency/necessity disjunction irrelevant, just as certain grammatical structures, essential to Latin, are irrelevant to the speaker of English. Dillard argues for Heidegger’s ‘philosophical position’ in a style that Heidegger sought to make impossible, only then to expose the position as fallacious. Heidegger’s critique of onto-theology is not just a rejection of the idea of a first cause; it is a rejection of the whole philosophical enterprise of searching for sufficient reasons for any claim (a game, which Heidegger agrees, that inevitably culminates in the affirmation of a first cause). Heidegger is no longer speaking the language of cause, proof, sufficient reason, adequate explanation, etc. Nonetheless, as a study of the late modern relevance of Duns Scotus, Dillard’s book makes an important contribution to the literature.

One of the weaknesses of Dillard’s book lies in his reading of Heidegger’s Habilitationsschrift. His lack of sympathy for the phenomenological outlook leads him to underplay the significance of speculative grammar for phenomenology in general, and for the early Heidegger’s phenomenological ontology in particular. This is a missed opportunity, for most Heideggerians do not read the Habilitationsschrift and would not likely understand it if they did. In a rather technical postscript Dillard draws some interesting connections between some of the remarks Heidegger makes in the Habilitationsschrift on the logical status of negations and privations and contemporary philosophy of mathematics. In this way Dillard recognizes a real contribution of the young Heidegger towards the contemporary relevance of medieval philosophy. But even this generous retrieval does not mitigate some of the more serious problems with Dillard’s reading of Heidegger’s approach to Thomas of Erfurt’s speculative grammar.

The first part of Heidegger’s Habilitationsschrift examines Scotus’s doctrine of the transcendentals (particularly being, truth, and unity). The second part takes up a work that until 1926 was regarded as Duns Scotus’s, De modis significandi sive Grammatica speculativa, the most important synthesis of medieval speculative grammar extant, which we now know was written by Thomas of Erfurt.2 These two parts do not flow easily together and are significant for Heidegger’s development in different ways. In the second part Heidegger selectively touches upon the moments in speculative grammar that he deems to be of greatest significance for phenomenology: the convergence of intentions and ontological structure, the multi-layered nature of the intentional act, the active intention of being (modus essendi activus), etc.

Dillard reads Erfurt metaphysically: speculative grammar is, in his view, primarily a realist theory of knowledge. Dillard’s reading of speculative grammar makes Erfurt sound like a naive realist: “Erfurt maintains that the grammatical structure of any possible language can be read off from the ontological structure of the world” (8).3 This is not how Heidegger reads Erfurt. What attracts Heidegger to Erfurt is the inseparability of structures commonly believed to be merely linguistic or intentional with ontological structures assumed to be mind-independent. Nevertheless this does not mean that grammatical structures are simply given independently of language. It means, for Heidegger, that many of the formal elements that we regard as “subjective”, “imposed”, “categorial”, or "a priori", are an integral part of the “objective”, intuited" or “given”, even though access to them is only through linguistic and intentionality analysis. The point for Heidegger is not that grammatical structure can be verified extra-linguistically; rather the point is that grammatical structure is ontological. This, according to Heidegger, motivates Erfurt’s alternative approach to language and logic, one that is so different from that typical of the neo-Kantians who dominated German philosophy at the beginning of the twentieth century. By turning to language and intentionality analysis one does not confine oneself to subjectivity; rather one opens up the only access possible to the deeper structures of the given. The young Heidegger grasped that Erfurt was close to Husserl in holding ‘categorical structure’ (the forms of intentions) to be given or ‘intuited’.4 What seemed necessary to Heidegger, already in 1916, and pre-figured by Erfurt, was a new approach to intentionality and ontology: neither an analysis of intentionality in suspension of ontology, nor an analysis of ontology in suspension of intentionality, but an ontological analysis of intentionality and an intentional analysis of ontology. Careful scholars of the early Heidegger see that the Erfurtian fusion of intentionality analysis and ontological inquiry is the basic assumption of Being and Time.5 Dillard, by contrast, passes over Being and Time in silence.

Although an extrinsicist approach such as Dillard’s could never satisfy a Heideggerian, it is in principle legitimate. One cannot stipulate of a given philosopher that here, only immanent critiques are valid. There is no necessity that philosophers accept Heidegger’s substitution of terms like “Dasein”, “temporality”, and "Ereignis" for other more commonly accepted philosophical terms. Indeed, Heidegger’s language is constructed in such a way as to make certain kinds of philosophical themes impossible. A Heideggerian lexicon could never be adequate to a philosophical exploration of the strengths and weaknesses of Scotus’s onto-theology. But by refusing to let Heidegger speak on his own terms, Dillard sometimes misses that which is new in Heidegger and has no precedent in medieval philosophy. Nevertheless, this is a bracing bit of metaphysics. Dillard does a brilliant job of developing the enduring relevance of Scotus’s argument for God’s existence post-Heidegger and quantum physics.

1 John Duns Scotus, A Treatise on God as First Principle, trans. Allan B. Wolter (Chicago: Franciscan Herald Press), chap. 3, 3.7.

2 Thomas of Erfurt, Grammatica speculative, trans. G. L. Bursill-Hall (London: Longman, 1972). On Erfurt see Jack Zupko, “Thomas of Erfurt”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2003 edition), ed. Edward N. Zalta, http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2003/entries/erfurt/.

3 See also (20): “Erfurt’s speculative grammar attributes to the mind the ability to apprehend a bewildering number of features of extralinguistic reality independently of possessing a language.” For a more phenomenological reading of Erfurt see S. J. McGrath, The Early Heidegger and Medieval Philosophy (Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2006), 88-119.

4 See the notion of ‘categorial intuition’ in Edmund Husserl, Logical Investigations, trans. J. N. Findlay (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1970), vol. 2, Investigation VI , §§40-48. For Heidegger’s interpretation of categorial intuition, see Martin Heidegger, History of the Concept of Time: Prolegomena, trans. Theodore Kisiel (Bloomington: Indiana UP, 1992), 47-72. On the significance of the notion for Heidegger’s study of Scotus, see S.J. McGrath, “Heidegger and Duns Scotus on Truth and Language”, Review of Metaphysics 57 (2003): 323-43.