Heidegger and Plato: Toward Dialogue

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Catalin Partenie and Tom Rockmore (eds.), Heidegger and Plato: Toward Dialogue, Northwestern University Press, 2005, 252pp, $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810122332.

Reviewed by Catherine Zuckert, University of Notre Dame


Although the blurb on the back cover claims that this collection of essays "is the first major work in English to focus explicitly on Martin Heidegger's complex and controversial reading of Plato," the editors in their introduction provide a list of scholarly works that have examined the relation between the two philosophers. Admitting that the brief historical account they give of the development of Heidegger's thought, in which the famous Kehre ("turn") may or may not be related to his reading of Plato, is controversial, the editors nevertheless give three reasons why Heidegger's reading of Plato is important. First, it helps us understand Heidegger's own thought. Second, it shows us the way in which Heidegger opened up new approaches to Plato (which have largely been ignored thus far by students of ancient philosophy who write in English). Third, it makes us more deeply aware of the problematic character of the study of the history of philosophy. Having argued ten years ago in Postmodern Platos that each stage of the development of Heidegger's thought is prefaced by a return to, and reinterpretation of, Plato, I could not agree more.

Unfortunately, the collection of essays with which the editors present us has no unifying theme or problem beyond observations concerning the way in which Heidegger read Plato. In fact, many, if not all of the essays show that Heidegger's reading of Plato was neither as original nor as "radical" and untraditional as Heidegger himself claimed. As Theodore Kiesel, Jacques Taminiaux, Maria de Carmen Paredes, Enrico Berti, and Stanley Rosen demonstrate, Heidegger took a great deal from Paul Natorp, G. W. F. Hegel, and Aristotle. But none of the authors makes the traditional character of Heidegger's reading of Plato the central point of his or her essay or asks what the persistence of the elements of a more traditional understanding of Plato means about the character and extent of Heidegger's purported "destruction" of the philosophical tradition. If Heidegger's reading of Plato owed so much to his predecessors, it would appear that he did not succeed in "uncovering" the original character of Greek philosophy, as he sometimes claimed that he had.

The essays do fall into three or four "groups" and so reveal an implicit organization in the volume as a whole. The first three essays concern Heidegger's attempt to appropriate Plato into his own thought. The second four examine the argument Heidegger gave in "Plato's Doctrine of the Truth" (1942), the only essay on Plato he published during his lifetime. Whatever Heidegger may have taken from Plato, all these authors agree, there is a fundamental difference in the understanding of truth held by the two philosophers. In a third, very long essay Johannes Fritsche looks at Heidegger's writings on Plato before and after his "turn" to show that the grounds of his support for Nazi politics persist. According to Fritsche, the changes in Heidegger's reading of Plato reflect rather than cause his disillusionment with Nazi politics. In the fourth and concluding part, Stanley Rosen and Tom Rockmore offer comprehensive critiques of Heidegger's reading of Plato from different perspectives and in fundamentally different respects. Neither of these essays concerns his politics so much as the character of his reading of the history of philosophy.

In the first two essays, Kisiel and Tanimiaux show that Heidegger took crucial parts of his understanding of both Plato and the Greek polis from Natorp and Hegel, and then argue that the understanding of Plato and the polis Heidegger inherited, so to speak, from his predecessors laid a foundation for his endorsement of the Nazis in his rector's address. Although these essays are extremely learned and provide interesting information about Heidegger's intellectual history and sources, they seem to share the same, two-sided blind spot. Externally, both authors ignore the obvious objection that other students of Natorp and Hegel -- Heidegger's own student Hans Georg Gadamer constituting a notable example -- did not join the party or endorse Nazi policies and politics the way Heidegger did. Internally, so to speak, in arguing that the educational politics Heidegger advocated in his rector's address can be traced back to Plato's Republic (or certain readings of it), both Kisiel and Taminiaux fail to observe that in his rector's address, Heidegger explicitly calls for a new beginning, i.e., he urges his auditors to go back before and behind Plato to begin anew. Heidegger's Nazi politics were, moreover, explicitly based on an historical analysis; he never endorsed the biological, genetic, or racial Nazi ideology that has been associated with Plato's "myth of the metals." In the third essay on Heidegger's appropriation of Plato, Catalin Partenie succeeds better in showing that certain themes Heidegger extracts from Plato in his 1924-25 lectures on the Sophist -- the centrality of speech (as well as its potential for abuse), the communal character of human existence, the need for the philosopher to break through everyday, conventional speech or opinion to disclose the truth, and the limitations of logos -- can, in fact, all be found in Platonic dialogues. In other words, Heidegger did not merely "read back into Plato parts of his [own] emerging fundamental ontology" (46).

In the first of the four essays on Plato's Doctrine of the Truth Michael Inwood begins by pointing out a certain degree of similarity between the two understandings of truth, disclosure and correctness (especially of speech with regard to reality), that Heidegger finds in Plato and the two different definitions of truth Plato proposes in the Theatetus (true belief with an appropriate logos) and Republic (belonging not to statements, but to forms or Ideas, such as the beautiful itself). Nevertheless, Inwood concludes that "Plato cannot mean by aletheia what Heidegger means by Unverborgenheit" (82-3). Both Plato and Heidegger see that human beings need to ascend from their everyday impressions and opinions to recognize truth, but Heidegger (unlike Plato) maintains that something is invariably hidden from us. Their respective definitions of truth thus belong to different problem contexts. In "Heidegger and the Platonic Concept of Truth" Enrico Berti shows that Heidegger continued to read Plato through an Aristotelian lens after the Sophist lectures. Paredes also observes, "Some years later, when he composed his essay on Platos Lehre von der Wahrheit, Heidegger gave up explicit use of his earlier Aristotelian interpretation of Plato, … But he continued to maintain and to make use of the methodological principle of emphasizing what is not said by the text as the main key to his discussion… . According to Heidegger, the world is first disclosed and then is at once later covered up by speech. Philosophy therefore has the double task of unconcealment: not only to overcome the initial condition of ignorance but also to abolish the supposed concealment of language" (113). Provocatively pointing out that Wittgenstein claimed, at one time or another, to satisfy both of the traditional definitions of truth, according to Heidegger, Joseph Margolis concludes this section by arguing passionately (but for that reason not altogether persuasively) that both of the definitions of truth dominant in twentieth-century philosophy, propositional and disclosing, are faulty.

In "With Plato into the Kairos before the Kehre: On Heidegger's Different Interpretations of Plato," Johannes Fritsche makes two extremely controversial claims. First, he maintains that the definition of human existence or Dasein that Heidegger puts forth in Being and Time is essentially communal. "Authenticity and historicality are not, as most American interpreters assume, about individual Dasein… . Rather, like the other conservatives and right-wingers at the time, Heidegger regards the development of modern Gesellshaft (society) as a falling and downward plunge (with liberalism, social welfare, socialism, and, finally, communism as its steps)… . Heidegger sides with the National Socialists and their call for the revitalization of the Volksgemeinschaft (community of the people)" (142-43). Second, Fritsche argues that the change in Heidegger's understanding of Being and the call (from a call of "conscience" within Dasein in Being and Time to restore a more authentic form of existence to the call of a mysterious "Being" to Dasein to disclose its gradual oblivion in the history of philosophy) that can be traced in Heidegger's successive readings of Plato in his lecture courses in 1931-32, 1933-34, and 1936 (later published as an Introduction to Metaphysics), results from the disappointment of his political hopes for National Socialism. Fritsche correctly observes that there is a closer relation between Heidegger's politics and his apparently very abstract thought than is often acknowledged, but Fritsche's argument is problematic in two major respects. First, in his reading of Being and Time, he ignores the confrontation with death that John Sallis has made central to his readings of both Heidegger and Plato (in Being and Logos) and that appears to be the source of human understanding of our mortality and hence the essential temporality and consequent historicity of Being, according to Heidegger himself. Second, recognizing that he cannot really prove his overarching claims about three complicated lecture courses in such a brief essay, Fritsche repeatedly gives multiple citations to his own (other) works. He thus admits, in effect, that he does not prove his case in the essay published in this volume.

Conceding that "Heidegger's attitude toward Plato varies from one period of his career to another," Stanley Rosen begins his "Remarks on Heidegger's Plato" by observing that at all times Heidegger associates Platonism primarily with the so-called theory of Ideas. And Rosen proceeds to show, Heidegger's understanding of the Platonic Ideas is simply wrong. Like Fritsche, Rosen makes two extremely important and controversial claims that he recognizes he cannot fully prove or document in a single essay. First, Rosen argues, Heidegger continues to read (and thus to distort) Plato's understanding of being or, to speak properly, of the beings through an Aristotelian lens. Second, Rosen maintains, Heidegger interprets Plato's definition of the being of the beings as the Idea of the Good in terms of utility, because Heidegger wants to show the way in which ancient philosophy is a "prototype of modern productionist metaphysics, with its preference for possibility and progressive mastery" (186). Rosen concludes, therefore, that the real philosophical battle is not between Heidegger and Plato, but between Plato and Kant. To understand the basis for Rosen's claims, one would have to go to his book-length study of the relation between Heidegger and Plato, The Question of Being (1993). There are only three specific citations to Heidegger's texts in this essay, and all three are to works produced in the 1930's.

In what should be not merely the final, but the concluding essay of the volume, Tom Rockmore presents Heidegger's use of Plato as an example of his reading of the history of philosophy more generally and concludes that there is no reasoned basis for Heidegger's phenomenological "hermeneutics." Rockmore divides interpretive theories into those which claim that it is possible to determine the "real" or "objective" meaning of a text and those which maintain that all readings reflect the particular interests of the reader and are, therefore, "subjective" as well as "multiple." He then argues that "Heidegger offers two views of interpretation as yielding phenomenological truth" (205) which correspond roughly to the two kinds of theory. Gadamer carries out the first thrust in Heidegger (although in Gadamer's "simplistic" fusion of horizons, Heidegger's "objective" reading becomes subjective); Derrida, the second. Because Heidegger never formulates a method in a Husserlian fashion, Rockmore concludes, neither of his phenomenological modes of interpretation produces the "objective," single or adequately justified reading of the work of an earlier philosopher that Heidegger claims to be giving.

Rockmore unfortunately bases his analysis solely on Being and Time in which Heidegger promotes a kind and necessity of "hermeneutics" that he subsequently drops. The difference between Heidegger and Gadamer is, indeed, signaled by the latter's continuing adherence to hermeneutics. In characterizing Heidegger's mode of interpretation as "objective," Rockmore does not appear to understand the essentially historical character of Heidegger's phenomenology, although Husserl did. He tried to respond by giving an alternative history (and not with his method). Like Derrida, Heidegger describes a process of historical change over time that results in the covering over and final obliterating of some things by the emergence (or imprinting, "writing") of others. Heidegger equates the history of Being with history of philosophy only in his post Being and Time writings. To understand and evaluate his treatment of the history, it would thus appear to be necessary to look at his later works. In explicit opposition to Derrida, Heidegger continues not only to write about 'Being' and the ontological difference, but also to maintain that all intelligibility requires a kind of horizon or closure in order to constitute a whole in the context of which to understand all its parts. In Being and Time Heidegger suggests that it is time that constitutes the horizon necessary for understanding, whereas in his later works the "opening" and "lighting" in which the beings become manifest is defined by the essentially mysterious "darkness" of "Being" that underlies and surrounds it. Even in his treatment of Being and Time Rockmore seems to miss the essentially historical character of Heidegger's analyses (as well as the difference between Wesen and Sein as well as ousia) when he objects to Heidegger's use of the example of the hammer (which Rockmore sees as "Nietzschean"): "It seems fairly obvious that any claim about, say, a hammer and the uses to which it can be put depends on the fact that Heidegger contingently happened to live in a society in which there were such things as hammers" (200). Heidegger's point is that things like hammers acquire their definition from their use in a society ("being-in-the-world") and not "in themselves." We ask the "theoretical" question, what something is, and thus transform the "ready at hand" into "present" only when it fails to function as expected. Theory or philosophy is derivative. That is the reason Heidegger insists that we need to question, criticize, and ultimately "destruct" the theoretical apparatus we have inherited in order to recapture the original experience from which it arose. That experience is, according to Heidegger, of the essentially mortal, hence temporal and historical character of Dasein, in Being and Time, and of "Being" itself, in his later works. Heidegger does not, in fact, claim to give a simply "objective" account of the works of previous philosophers. As Berti points out, Heidegger finds what is not said more important than what is.

Heidegger and Plato would have had more cumulative impact if the editors had provided more of a theoretical framework in which to place the individual essays. The fundamental disagreements among the contributors -- both substantive and methodological -- may have made much integration of their essays, even by way of contrast, impossible.