Heidegger and the Contradiction of Being: An Analytic Interpretation of the Late Heidegger

Heidegger And The Contradiction Of Being

Filippo Casati, Heidegger and the Contradiction of Being: An Analytic Interpretation of the Late Heidegger, Routledge, 2022, 186pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367230104.

Reviewed by Katherine Withy, Georgetown University


In his book, Filippo Casati argues that Martin Heidegger, in his later work, endorses dialetheism. Dialetheism is the view that some contradictions are true. Casati argues that Heidegger holds two specific contradictory assertions to be true: that being is both not an entity and an entity and, as a result, that being both cannot be the subject of an assertion and can be the subject of an assertion. Heidegger’s endorsement of the latter contradiction follows from his endorsement of the former since, according to Casati, to be an entity is to be a potential subject of an assertion, and all assertions are about entities. That thinking and talking about being leads to these contradictions is what makes being perplexing and question-worthy for Heidegger, according to Casati, and also what leads him to dialetheism.

The book contains six brief chapters, plus an introduction and conclusion. The first chapter, ‘On Being and Entities,’ establishes the key premises that Casati will rely on: that to be an entity is to be a potential subject of an assertion, to be self-identical, and to have a reason; and that ‘being’ refers either to that in terms of which entities are intelligible or to that which makes entities be entities. The second chapter, ‘On the Difference between Being and Entities,’ introduces and attempts to motivate the distinction between being and entities, which Heidegger calls the ontological difference. The ontological difference guarantees that being is not an entity. The third chapter, ‘On a Very Destitute Matter,’ posits two problematic paradoxes in Heidegger’s thought, arising from the fact that, despite the ontological difference, being appears to have characteristics belonging to entities. First, if all assertions are about entities, then it is impossible to assert anything about being. And yet, Heidegger makes assertions about being. Second, if being is what makes entities be, then it must itself in some sense be. Yet Heidegger insists that it is not an entity. After surveying a few of the ways in which these tensions have been addressed in the scholarship, Casati proceeds to his own resolution in Chapter 4, ‘On Beyng’: the paradoxes do not need to be solved but reveal that being is inconsistent and so that some contradictory assertions hold of it—namely, that being both is and is not an entity, and that being both is and is not a possible subject of an assertion. Casati selects passages from Heidegger’s corpus to offer as evidence that Heidegger does in fact hold these contradictions to be true of being. In Chapter 5, ‘On Beyng and Nothing,’ he argues, by appeal to an inconsistent mereological framework, that endorsing these contradictions does not lead Heidegger into logical triviality, and in Chapter 6, ‘On the Abyss,’ Casati draws conclusions from his interpretation about the relationship between being and entities.

Casati is clear that he is offering, as the subtitle has it, “an analytic interpretation” of Heidegger’s later thought. The book is written for the “hard-nosed analytic philosopher” (43) who, I take it, is unfamiliar with Heidegger’s thought and texts. Casati’s book thus belongs in the company of some of the work by, for example, Graham Priest and Paul Edwards. Because it is neither strictly a work in the history of philosophy nor strictly a contribution to the literature on dialetheism, Casati’s work finds itself curiously between genres. This in-between position explains the book’s strengths and weaknesses, which I will assess from my own perspective as someone who works in the history of philosophy.

The great virtue of Casati’s approach is its argumentative clarity. Casati’s prose is clear and he takes great pains to lay out his argument exhaustively, step-by-step. Readers accustomed to so-called ‘analytic’ philosophy and who have no background in Heidegger will be capable of working through Casati’s argument and should find some of its Heidegger-inspired philosophical moves novel and interesting.

But argumentative clarity should not be won at the cost of context. Since Heidegger himself does not present his arguments through step-by-step reasoning, it is crucial when reading his work to pay attention to context—rhetorical, argumentative, and textual. This context frequently reveals that Heidegger is trying to do things with his words: to perplex us, to reveal unquestioned assumptions, to mislead us into thinking that he holds a view contrary to his own, and to gently free us from our common-sense philosophical commitments. That one must work to see what Heidegger is doing with his words is a demand which his texts make on readers, for which readers are often unprepared. Any approach to Heidegger’s texts that proceeds by isolating propositions from excerpted passages risks failing to meet this demand and misrepresenting Heidegger’s views.

My primary criticism of Casati’s argument is that its excerpting of passages in support of its claims frequently omits crucial context. Casati often relies more on secondary literature than on primary texts, but he does turn to primary texts at crucial junctures—especially in Chapter 4, where he appeals to particular passages in order to show that it is “exegetically tenable” (100) that Heidegger is a dialetheist. He writes: “If Heidegger is a dialetheist, we should be able to find some textual evidence in which Heidegger explicitly opposes (classical) logic and, in particular, one of its core principles, that is, the Principle of Non-Contradiction” (100). Casati offers nine excerpts in direct support of the consequent of this conditional. He goes on to give reason to believe the antecedent of the conditional by appealing to Heidegger’s Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event) in order to show that Heidegger also accepts the relevant contradictory statements about being, providing seven excerpts in direct support. Let me take three of the passages that Casati appeals to in these arguments and show how reading them in their full context makes them unsuitable for Casati’s purposes.

First, the most compelling evidence that Casati offers for his claim that Heidegger rejects the principle of non-contradiction is the following passage:

The principle of common logic, namely the law of avoiding contradiction, must be annihilated and thus precisely validate contradiction as the basic trait of all that is actual.” (Heidegger, 2012, 83, quoted in Casati, 107)

Casati presents this passage as Heidegger’s own words (“Heidegger writes” (107)) and further asserts that “Heidegger himself claims [ . . . that] questioning logic and the Principle of Non-Contradiction is the ‘highest task of any higher logic’” (106–107).[1] This certainly sounds like Heidegger is rejecting the principle of non-contradiction. But the full context of the passage reveals that Heidegger is in fact quoting and glossing the poet Novalis (underlined):

contradiction is unveiled as what unites and endures. This appears to contradict what Novalis writes in one of his fragments: “to annihilate the principle of contradiction is perhaps the highest task of a higher logic”. But the thoughtful poet means to say: The principle of common logic, namely the law of avoiding contradiction, must be annihilated and thus precisely validate contradiction as the basic trait of all that is actual. What Novalis says here is exactly the same as what Hegel thinks: annihilate the principle of contradiction in order to save contradiction as the law of the actuality of the actual. (2012, 83)

Not only is Heidegger quoting Novalis but he takes Novalis to be articulating Hegel’s view. This crucial context is lost when the passage is excerpted, and this is what allows Casati to present the claim as Heidegger’s own. Further, had the passage been presented in its full context, Casati would have had to offer a broader consideration of its argumentative and rhetorical context—broader than that which he gives for similar excerpts discussing Hegel, Heraclitus, and Nietzsche, respectively, on the principle of non-contradiction (105–6). One cannot directly conclude from Heidegger’s invocation of another thinker’s position on this principle anything about Heidegger’s own position. While Casati is right that “many of the essays which Heidegger devotes to the discussion of other thinkers reveal crucial features of his own philosophy” (105), precisely what is revealed, and how, remains to be determined in each case.

A second example: Casati cites this passage from Being and Truth as evidence that Heidegger rejects the principle of non-contradiction:

If the principle and the way of treating it have been moving for a long time within a nearly unassailable self-evidence, this may not be taken as a definitive unquestionability pure and simple; rather, we must consider that this fundamentally thin veneer of the self-evident will one day break apart and that we will then break through into the groundless, at least at first. (Heidegger, 2010, 48, quoted in Casati, 115–116)

Heidegger here suggests that the principle of non-contradiction will not always remain self-evident to us. But this does not show that he does not think it holds. That Heidegger wants to show the principle not to be self-evident tells us little by itself beyond the fact that he wants to problematise something that we typically take for granted. This is a common strategy that Heidegger employs in order to open space for philosophical exploration. Further, the surrounding context in fact suggests that, far from rejecting the principle of non-contradiction, Heidegger takes it to be central to his accounts of being and Dasein (the entity that each of us is). Heidegger says that the principle of non-contradiction expresses the “inevitability of the law of Being in the sense of the preservation of selfsameness” and that the principle is “a fundamental element of the existential structure of our Dasein in general” (2010, 46–47).[2] He goes on: “The truth that pertains to this principle is a primally distinctive one—and so far we have no concept of it at all”—because, of course, we take it to be immediately self-evident (ibid, 47). Only by undermining this self-evidence can we understand the principle and its truth. Of course, the fragments that I quote to suggest this reading are themselves decontextualised and so do not by themselves show that Heidegger accepts the principle of non-contradiction. But this serves only to reinforce my point: there is a lot more going on in the text than Casati’s excerpting acknowledges.

A third, and final, example: at several points, Casati relies on taking “the meaning of Being to be nothing more,” and so nothing other, “than Being itself” (46, cf. 71), such that ‘being’ and ‘the meaning of being’ are equivalent and so interchangeable in arguments and interpretations of texts. In addition to invoking “many scholars [who] have successfully argued” (71, 87, cf. 47) for this reading, specifically Taylor Carman (47), Casati cites this passage from Being and Time: if we are inquiring about the meaning of Being, our investigation does not then become a ‘deep’ one, nor does it puzzle out what stands behind Being. It asks about Being itself. . . . ”(1962, 193 (H152), quoted in Casati, 46).

Casati omits the final clause: “in so far as Being enters into the intelligibility of Dasein” (Heidegger, 1962, 193 (H152)). But this clause is crucial for understanding the passage’s meaning. The claim is that asking about the meaning of being does not involve looking for some further thing beyond being (whatever that might be) but amounts to asking how being makes sense to us. That asking about the meaning of being means asking about being (insofar as it makes sense to us) does not, however, license treating the two as equivalent. Here is how Carman explains it:

Consider by way of analogy asking about a foreign or ancient word by addressing or ‘interrogating’ a text in order to ascertain the word’s meaning. One can distinguish the word from its meaning in this merely formal and provisional way without denying that the meaning is, after all, constitutive of the word, that the meaning is what makes the word the word it is, and that to understand the word is in effect to understand its meaning. So too, for Heidegger, being is constituted by the meaning of being, so that an understanding of being is in effect the same as an understanding of its meaning.[3] (2003, 16)

Carman is clear that the relation between being and the meaning of being is one of constitution rather than equivalence, such that an understanding of the one is in effect an understanding of the other. But this is so only from the perspective of our understanding: within the intelligibility of Dasein. It does not mean that the one is the other, in effect or otherwise, and so it does not license substituting one for the other.

Of course, the relationship between being, the meaning of being, and Dasein’s understanding of being is complex and this makes interpreting the passage fraught. In general, Casati’s argument would have benefitted from working out a stand on the relations between these—particularly the relationship between being and Dasein’s understanding of being. In the absence of this stand, it becomes unclear whether the contradictions that Casati finds Heidegger attributing to being belong to being or to our understanding of it (or both, perhaps one as the result of the other). The issue comes to a head in the conclusion to the text, where Casati defers to another time discussion of the fact that contradictions obtain between propositions while the phenomenon that Heidegger names by ‘being’ is not a proposition. I suspect that this is a much bigger problem than Casati allows, especially if he intends to establish that Heidegger is a dialetheist and if dialetheism is a stand on propositional truth and falsity. If Heidegger takes no such stand but nonetheless says contradictory things about being, perhaps he is not a dialetheist but is merely contradicting himself. Our task as readers would then be to ask why.

So, as a historian of philosophy, I am not persuaded by Casati’s evidence or argument. But I am not his audience. And I do not think that the “hard-nosed analytic philosopher” (43) whom Casati imagines as his reader particularly cares whether Heidegger was a dialetheist or not. Such a reader will likely be more interested in the paraconsistent logic that Casati develops in the final two chapters, which I am not in a position to assess. Overall, the book reveals what a dialetheist would find interesting to chew on—and thereby, transform—were they to look in Heidegger’s texts for food for thought.


Carman, T. (2003) Heidegger’s Analytic: Interpretation, Discourse, and Authenticity in Being and Time. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Heidegger, M. (1962) Being and Time, trans. J. Macquarrie and E. Robinson. New York: Harper & Row.

Heidegger, M. (2010) Being and Truth, trans. G. Fried. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

Heidegger, M. (2012) Bremen and Freiburg Lectures: Insight Into That Which Is and Basic Principles of Thinking, trans. A.J. Mitchell. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

[1] Casati here cites Heidegger, Bremen and Freiburg Lectures, 86 [sic].

[2] Both passages are italicised in the original.

[3] Casati quotes the final sentence of this passage (47).