Heidegger and the Emergence of the Question of Being

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Jesús Adrián Escudero, Heidegger and the Emergence of the Question of Being, Juan Pablo Hernández Betancur (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2015, 203pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 97811472511805.

Reviewed by Daniel L. Tate, St. Bonaventure University


Heidegger often remarked that every great philosopher thinks one single thought. In this book -- a very capable translation of a shortened version of the author's previously published Heidegger y la genealogía de la pregunta por el ser (2010) -- Jesús Adrián Escudero takes this saying to heart, applying it to the path of Heidegger's own thought leading up to Being and Time. He unfolds a "genealogical interpretation" that offers a "coherent and unitary interpretation" (10) of Heidegger's early work. By focusing on the being of factical life as the guiding thread of his interpretation, Escudero tracks the emergence of the question of being in Heidegger's thought. While this focus may be no surprise, Escudero's claim that the horizon of this question is present in Heidegger's thinking from the outset is certainly more provocative.

Drawing on the abundant material now available from this period in the Gesamtausgabe, Escudero positions his approach between two others prevalent in the literature. The first, prompted by Theodore Kisiel's research, regards Heidegger's early thought as developing in relatively independent stages, yielding an "excessively compartmentalized" account that Escudero believes mistaken. His approach would supplement Kisiel's historical and genetic account with a systematic understanding of Heidegger's early lecture courses. The second approach, represented by Gadamer, construes the early Freiburg lecture courses on the basis of Heidegger's later philosophy of the event. In Escudero's view this absorption of early to late Heidegger overlooks the aim of these courses to provide a hermeneutics of factical life. In contrast to both positions, he contends that the early Freiburg courses (1919-1923) along with the Marburg courses (1924-1928) comprise "one unitary pathway" (17) by which Heidegger sought to recover the primordial roots of human life in order to attain an understanding of being.

Escudero proposes that Heidegger's early work be articulated along two axes, one thematic, the other methodological. The thematic axis revolves around the systematic analysis of the ontological structures of human life or Dasein; the methodological axis consists in the development of a hermeneutic phenomenology and the destruction of the history of metaphysics. Moreover, he maintains that these two axes are correlative. The focus on human life in its concrete, historical character requires the destruction of metaphysics and the hermeneutic transformation of phenomenology as the means necessary to gaining primordial access to factical life. "The subject matter and the method cannot be separated" (20). These axes provide the guiding thread for Escudero's systematic account of what he calls "young Heidegger's philosophical programme" (10).

After a short chapter sketching the "Historical and Intellectual Context" of young Heidegger's thought, Escudero elicits "The Hidden Root of Being in Heidegger's Early Writings." Here in Heidegger's youthful work on philosophical logic (1912-1916) he sees the first, albeit implicit, emergence of the issue of being. Heidegger's earliest writings on this matter address the logical comportment of asserting and judging to find the fundamental ontological structures that remain veiled by traditional logic. This project, Escudero notes, "puts us in the domain of judgment, truth and the categorical apprehension of being" (23). Following Husserl, Heidegger criticizes both formalism and psychologism in logic and adopts his mentor's distinction between the psychic act and its logical content, between what "is" and what has "validity," which Heidegger construes as an "ontological difference" between real and ideal being. For Heidegger, Escudero holds, the problem of logic is inseparable from the question of being.

However, this leaves the problem of how the static, a-temporal character of logical validity relates to dynamic, temporal being. The work of Emil Lask points Heidegger toward a way of resolving this problem by a more radical grounding of logic. According to Lask's revision of the form/matter distinction, form infuses meaning into matter, rendering it intelligible. But Lask also holds that form does not exhaust the reality of things, which retain a remnant of contingency and opacity that resists rational comprehension. As correlative concepts, form and matter exhibit a "primordial relation" between validity and being. Further, each form is embedded in a meaningful structure that is pre-theoretically comprehensible. For Lask we always think within such a sphere of pre-theoretical comprehension or, as Heidegger will put it, we always live within a horizon of meaning. Under the influence of Husserl and Lask, Heidegger conceives the grounding of logic as a search for the conditions of its possibility in the pre-logical experience of the historical world, that is, in a prior openness to the world.

In "From the Being of Factical Life to the Meaning of Being as Such" Escudero pursues the development of the thematic core of Heidegger's early philosophical project. There he discusses Heidegger's interest in the phenomenon of life, focusing on his phenomenology of religion and his critical appropriation of Aristotle's philosophy. In order to elucidate the experience of factical life, Heidegger attends to the experience of religious life, especially in primitive Christianity. His reading of St. Paul's epistles seeks to recover the primordial experience of factical life covered over by the Greek conceptuality of Christian theology. The emphasis on constant being present in Greek metaphysics distorts the temporality of factical life expressed in the historical content of the Incarnation, the Crucifixion, and the Second Coming. Instead, Heidegger emphasizes the triad of primitive Christianity -- Deus absconditus, faith and kairological time -- where God is experienced as the hidden God who manifests himself historically in the Crucifixion and Incarnation, and who will return in the Second Coming which, as imminent but uncertain, must be embraced by faith, not knowledge.

Escudero underscores those Pauline insights into Christian existence that Heidegger appropriates for his understanding of human factical life. Heidegger takes over Paul's distinction between two basic and irreconcilable ways of existing -- between living in darkness apart from grace and living in the light, awaiting the arrival of Christ -- into his concepts of inauthentic and authentic existence. Indeed, it is especially difficult to separate Heidegger from Paul where he addresses the fall into the everyday world and the anxiety caused by the uncertainty concerning the moment of the parousia. Moreover, his appeal to conscience echoes Paul's where its illuminating power counters the tendency to fallenness and self-deception. It also lays bare the guilt and finitude of the believer just as Heidegger's call of conscience draws Dasein out of its lostness in the They, placing it before its own possibilities and projecting it upon its essential guilt. But above all, Heidegger recognizes temporality as the condition for the possibility of this experience. The temporality of Christian facticity accents the moment of decision that compels us to face our historicity and assume responsibility for our decisions. This moment oscillates between past and future, between remembrance and expectation of Christ's imminent return in the kairos, the fulfillment of time. Thus the historicity of repetition in Christian existence proves crucial to Heidegger's recasting the question of the meaning of being in the horizon of kairological temporality.

However, it is his rediscovery of Aristotle that makes possible a genuine phenomenology of life for Heidegger. Escudero highlights Aristotle's practical philosophy due to its central role in Heidegger's development of a hermeneutic phenomenology of factical life. But he acknowledges that Heidegger's interest in this subject is ontological rather than ethical. By stripping the basic concepts of Aristotle's practical philosophy of their practical nature, Heidegger appropriates them as fundamental modes of human being. Practical philosophy thus becomes an ontology of human life. Heidegger seizes upon Aristotle's concepts of praxis (human action) and phronesis (practical wisdom) for his own interpretation of Dasein's being by construing them as fundamental ontological determinations of human life. For Aristotle, deliberation and decision belong to the sphere of human action while practical wisdom is the capacity to deliberate and decide in the right way. Likewise, as an entity whose being is always at stake, Dasein must assume responsibility for choosing among its possibilities. On the one hand, by radicalizing praxis Heidegger can identify the being of Dasein as care. Existence is primarily a matter of practical comportment where one's being is at issue. On the other hand, phronesis embodies a mode of truth that uncovers Dasein in its concrete facticity. Practical wisdom aims at unveiling Dasein's authentic potentiality to be itself despite its tendency to become immersed in everyday matters. Here phronesis combines with kairos, the moment of decision, yielding a practical relation to self conceived as a concrete decision about my own possibility for being. Heidegger thereby appropriates Aristotle's practical philosophy for his ontology of human facticity.

Escudero also relates Heidegger's interest in Aristotle's concept of kinesis to the problem of facticity as a problem of the movedness (Bewegtheit) of human life, in contrast to the movement (Bewegung) of physical entities. Heidegger does not conceive of kinesis as a worldly feature of entities but as the primordial movedness by which world disclosure occurs. This requires Heidegger to deconstruct the hidden tendency of Greek philosophy, including Aristotle, to reduce beings to what is present, stable, and usable. This corresponds to the understanding of being as ousia. Laying bare the ousiological presupposition of Greek ontology, Heidegger exposes the tendency to think being as a modality of presence. For Escudero this, too, relates to the hermeneutics of facticity insofar as Dasein is not reducible to what is merely present. Indeed, Dasein's way of being-towards-the-end reflects its being essentially unfinished. The kinesis distinctive of Dasein is thus the movedness involved in the uncovering of beings. But the movedness proper to disclosedness invokes Dasein's primordial temporality, which prompts Heidegger's turn from Aristotle to Kant in an effort to think time as the horizon for the manifestation of being.

In the final chapter on the "Development and Methodological Presuppositions of the Hermeneutic Phenomenology" Escudero elucidates the principal steps in the development of Heidegger's hermeneutic phenomenology by profiling it against Husserl's reflective phenomenology. In his words,

Heidegger's thinking here brings Husserl against Husserl, as it were, in the name of a new beginning, understood as a return to the things themselves. Strict application of Husserl's motto demands an internal critique of the phenomenology of consciousness in order to safeguard being. (125)

In contrast to Husserl, who adopts a theoretical attitude, Heidegger's phenomenology seeks to comprehend the being of factical life as it is immediately given in our practical comportments. It is Heidegger's discovery of this pre-theoretical domain that requires the development of a hermeneutic approach that would enable primordial access to that domain. In order to articulate the understanding that life has of itself Heidegger devises concepts that function as formal indicators. As formal, such concepts lack content; as indicators they point the direction in which human being actualizes itself. For Heidegger, formal indication is not about the content, the 'what', but the mode of actualization, the 'how.' Against Husserl's concept of evidence as the intuitive fulfillment of an empty form by an adequate perception, Heidegger holds that the thing's presence does not obviate the need for understanding. Meaning is involves enactment, not just apprehension.

For Heidegger, the long-standing predominance of the theoretical attitude, which still prevails in Husserlian phenomenology, hides and distorts the primarily practical relation we have with the world. Things do not show themselves primordially within the inner space of consciousness; they are rather encountered from out of the surrounding world and only become accessible and intelligible due to our prior belonging to a meaningful world. This "context of significance" constitutes our familiarity with the world we inhabit and provides the "horizon of meaningfulness" that precedes all acts of perception and knowledge. In this way, Heidegger remains faithful to the primordial givenness of things, which only show themselves primordially in an event of appropriation (Er-eignis) and not as objects of a reflective act of consciousness. Access to this pre-theoretical domain of disclosedness requires "parenthesizing" the theoretical attitude in favor of a pre-ontological understanding that life has of its own being.

Consequently, Heidegger is critical of Husserl's "Cartesian" turn. He confronts Husserl's failure to pose the question of the being of consciousness. While Husserl determines consciousness to be immanent, absolute, absolutely given, and pure, Heidegger argues that these determinations are not warranted by phenomenological analysis. Instead they are metaphysical suppositions of the scientific prejudice that underwrites the appeal to pure consciousness. This prejudice is also evident in Husserl's understanding of the natural attitude, which is theoretically determined by the subject-object standpoint. Moreover, Heidegger criticizes Husserl's reduction for concealing the being of intentionality by separating the immanent intentio from the transcendent intentum. For Heidegger, the being of intentionality consists in the disclosedness of, and transcendence toward, the world as that which is revealed in the practical comportments of human life. Here, Escudero notes, two concepts of intentionality confront each other: "the Husserlian one on which intentionality is isolated from the world and enclosed in its own noetic activity; and the Heideggerian one, on which intentionality is opened to the world in its noematic dimension" (130). Likewise, their conceptions of world diverge: for one, the world is encountered in the conscious flux of intentional lived experiences, while the other engages the world as a horizon for their projects and possibilities. Although he treats these as rival visions of phenomenology -- a reflective phenomenology of consciousness versus a hermeneutic phenomenology of Dasein -- Escudero also acknowledges the limitations to Heidegger's criticisms of Husserl's project.

Escudero concludes his account of the development of hermeneutic phenomenology by drawing attention to the ontological difference as the implicit presumption of the young Heidegger's thought. This, he argues, is what is at issue when Heidegger replaces the empirical/transcendental dichotomy of transcendental philosophy with the ontic/ontological difference of fundamental ontology. Although Heidegger does not explicitly use the term until 1929, Escudero asserts that the ontological difference is in play throughout the preceding decade. The pre-understanding of being is precisely what allows Dasein to comprehend the difference between being and beings. If the possibility of gaining access to being belongs to Dasein, then it is there, in Dasein, that the ontological difference manifests itself. This implies, first, that beings are accessible in their being (granting being transcendental priority over beings) and, second, that the understanding of being is due to its contingent, historical character of Dasein (effecting a de-transcendentalizing of the subject).

Escudero puts forth a strong case for a unified interpretation of Heidegger's early thought. It is especially helpful in weaving together the diverse strands of Heidegger's work -- on logic, religious life, Aristotle's philosophy, and Husserl's phenomenology -- during the decade and a half preceding the publication of Being and Time. By emphasizing the correlation of theme and method, of Heidegger's focus on the being of factical life and his development of hermeneutic phenomenology, Escudero enables us to better appreciate the emergence of the question of being in the young Heidegger's thinking. Regardless of whether one is convinced that his early thought constitutes a "philosophical programme", we can be grateful that this translation makes available in English the substantial work of this Heidegger scholar.