Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy

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Peter Trawny, Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy, Andrew J. Mitchell (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2015, 147pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226303734.

Reviewed by Taylor Carman, Barnard College


In February and March of 2014 the first three (hefty) volumes of Heidegger's diaries dating from the 1930s and '40s -- widely known by their rather ominous subtitle, the Black Notebooks -- were published as vols. 94-96 of the Gesamtausgabe (vol. 97 appeared a year later, and there are more to come). So far they comprise nearly 2000 pages of more or less esoteric, often obscure and idiosyncratic, occasionally fascinating ruminations on matters internal to Heidegger's philosophical thinking, but they also touch on university politics (vol. 94 includes his year as rector of Freiburg University, 1933-34) and -- though with little concrete detail -- the situation in Germany and the wider world.

A handful of pages are genuinely shocking, revealing as they do the depth and persistence of Heidegger's anti-Semitism before, during, and after the war. In 1939, for example, he writes,

With their marked gift for calculation, the Jews "live" according to the principle of race, and indeed have done so for the longest time, for which reason they themselves most vigorously resist its unrestricted application. The arrangement of racial breeding stems not from "life" itself, but from the hyperempowerment of life by machination (Machenschaft). What this brings about with such planning is a complete deracination of peoples by harnessing them in a uniformly constructed and streamlined arrangement of all entities. Along with deracination goes a self-alienation of peoples -- the loss of history -- i.e. of the regions of decision for beyng (Seyn).[1]

Needless to say, these comments are appalling not just because Heidegger invokes the hackneyed stereotype of a Jewish "gift for calculation," but because he willfully deflects the charge of racism away from Nazi persecution back onto the Jews themselves, who "'live' according to the principle of race," and for this reason "most vigorously resist its unrestricted application."

Moreover, Heidegger says, planned racial selection is an effect of "machination" (Machenschaft, his term for the total technological organization of the world), whose actual effect is "deracination" (Entrassung). Although the German word Entrassung refers more explicitly to biological race, here Heidegger clearly means uprooting, which justifies the translation "deracination," from the French racine (root or stem). As Peter Trawny rightly points out, Heidegger's rejection of biological racism did not prevent him from invoking an older, more primitive concept of "race" (Heidegger frequently uses quotation marks), which appeals broadly to cultural as well as natural origins. So, for example, Heidegger refers in the early 1930s to "the power of 'race' (of the native-born)," and to a kind of national "truth (nature -- soil -- blood -- homeland -- landscape -- gods -- death)."[2]

An even more perverse case of victim blaming is Heidegger's reference during the war to Jewish "self-annihilation" (Selbstvernichtung) -- possibly the most grotesque phrase in all the Black Notebooks (so far) and one that has generated much discussion:

Only when what is essentially "Jewish" in the metaphysical sense battles against the Jewish is the pinnacle of self-annihilation in history attained; assuming that what is "Jewish" has everywhere seized dominion entirely for itself, such that even the battle "of the Jewish," and this above all, becomes subjection to it.[3]

The insinuation that the Jews themselves were responsible for their own destruction is so beyond the pale of reason and decency that the passage cries out for some hermeneutical effort and reflection. What could Heidegger possibly have been thinking?

As it turns out, the dubious quotation marks are the key to making sense of this tortured, disastrous line of thought. By "Jewish" (in quotation marks) Heidegger means the hyperrational, calculative, technological ordering and manipulation of everything. In this (perverse) sense, Soviet communism and American capitalism are both "essentially 'Jewish'" -- and so is Nazism, at least by the late 1930s, that is, in the form it had by then assumed of a fully mobilized, military-industrial killing machine. So Heidegger can refer, in a hopelessly confused way, to

the historical process which England plays out to the end from within Americanism and Bolshevism, and this means at the same time also from within world Judaism (Weltjudentum). The question concerning the role of world Judaism is not a racial one, but rather the metaphysical question concerning the kind of humanity which, utterly unattached, can take over the uprooting of all beings from being as its world-historical "task."[4]

This emptying out and distorting of ordinary concepts with empirical content in favor of bogus metaphysical abstractions is typical of Heidegger's (pseudo)political ruminations in the Black Notebooks, and the resulting vacuousness of his thinking in passages like this can be seen in the way he blithely assigns the same generic names to a vast and disparate array of concrete things.

So, as Trawny points out, Heidegger refers in the fourth of the published volumes of the Black Notebooks (GA 97) not only to "Jewish" self-annihilation, but to the self-annihilation of technology, of Dasein, of thinking, and of the Germans, as well as to the (mere) "annihilation" (Vernichtung) of humanity and of truth. The logic (or trope) of "self-annihilation" was for Heidegger a formula, a schema with which to make sense of the abject failure of the National Socialism that had been the object of his fantasies in the 1930s -- a Nazism that would be folkish, provincial, socialistic, anti-industrial, anti-technological, anti-modern, above all somehow rich in "metaphysical" significance.

Although recognizing the egregious abstractness of Heidegger's thinking in passages like this sheds some light on comments that might otherwise sound even more bizarre and obtuse than they actually are, it does nothing to excuse his reckless use of the word "Jewish" as a placeholder for the calculative, technological forces of machination. What is shameful about such remarks is not that Heidegger is literally asserting that the Jews were responsible for their own annihilation, but rather that he fabricates the altogether imaginary concept of the "essentially 'Jewish'" and applies it alongside ordinary references to Judaism and Jews themselves -- the Jewish without quotation marks -- as if something "essential" tied the metaphysical fiction to actual human beings, their lives, their sufferings, their deaths. What is offensive in all this, it seems to me, is not the absurd insinuation that the Jews who were murdered by the Nazis somehow killed themselves, but instead Heidegger's sheer indifference to reality in favor of his own metaphysical constructs, as if the merely ontic particulars were of no consequence compared to what was ontologically at stake in the "history of being" (Seinsgeschichte).

Which brings us to the present volume, a short book in which Trawny tries to say what, if anything, the anti-Semitic passages in the Black Notebooks have to tell us about Heidegger's thought. That there are connections between his Nazism and anti-Semitism and his philosophical thinking in the 1930s and '40s is clear. Heidegger himself insisted on it, and although an author's self-interpretation is not always the final word, it's not hard to see Heidegger's early enthusiasm for Hitler and his hatred of cosmopolitanism and liberal values as at once reflecting and reinforcing his defense of contextual, intuitive understanding and his critique of the limits and dangers of calculative rationality. Beyond reminding us of that general affinity, however, what is the precise significance of the Black Notebooks for our understanding of Heidegger's philosophy?

That is the question. Unfortunately, Trawny's book does very little to answer it. His thesis is that anti-Semitism is present and at work in Heidegger's account of the history of being, which is to say, the history in Western thought of successive, comprehensive understandings of what it means to be, of what and that anything is. The anti-Semitism that figures into the history of being is what Trawny calls Heidegger's "being-historical anti-Semitism." To get a grip on that (in English) twice-hyphenated phrase, one would of course need to begin with a clear account of the very idea of a history of being, and about that Trawny says almost nothing. The argument of the book consequently never really gets off the ground. What is being-historical anti-Semitism in contrast to anti-Semitism as such? Is it just the same old thing, or is it something different, something unique to Heidegger? The closest thing to a definition appears about halfway through the book:

Being-historical anti-Semitism consists in Heidegger thinking: the Jews, living "in accordance with the principle of race," in the "unconditionality" of "machination," this "brutalitas of being," interpret themselves in a manner founded precisely on this "principle of race," which surrenders them, "utterly unattached," to the pursuit of an "uprooting of beings" with the aim and intent of their "unfurling of power." World Judaism must have appeared to him as a people, or as a group within a people, who single-mindedly pursue no other aim than the putrefaction of all other peoples: a "race" that consciously pursues the "deracination of the peoples." (45-6)

The problem with this, aside from its being virtually a string of quotations rather than a clear, independently formulated idea, is that it sounds a lot like plain old anti-Semitism, or perhaps a slightly dressed up version of a handful of particularly noxious anti-Semitic clichés: Jews are hyperrational, they are rootless nomads, and it is precisely their own "racial" chauvinism that explains and justifies the recurring nationalistic, racist backlash that so frequently targets them as victims. A reprehensible stereotype, to be sure, but a familiar one.

True, Heidegger attaches that ugly stereotype to his own concerns about calculative thinking, modern alienation, and the meaning and importance of dwelling and being at home. But does that attachment of the stereotype to the original line of thought constitute a new, distinctive kind of anti-Semitism, or is the connection superficial, opportunistic, ad hoc? Undeniably, there is anti-Semitism in Heidegger's philosophical thought, but is there any (even remotely interesting) philosophical thought in his anti-Semitism? Jewish culture cannot have been the source of the dominance of calculative rationality in Western understandings of being, on his own account. Nor did he believe there was any necessary connection between technological machination and actual Judaism. Instead, as we saw above, the word "Jewish" was for him an ethnic slur, a blanket term to be applied indiscriminately to anything exhibiting excessive rational calculation, uprootedness, spiritual shallowness, and strategic cunning. One might therefore worry that the phrase "being-historical anti-Semitism" is itself a mere ad hoc construct, like "Cubist misogyny" or "Pre-Raphaelite Protestantism" -- a mere conjunction, the conceptually sterile hybrid of an innovative line of thought on the one hand, and something altogether conventional and banal on the other.

Trawny at times inclines toward this merely conjunctive, deflationary approach, for example when he suggests that the remarks about Jews and Judaism in the Black Notebooks are little more than conventional bigotry, to which Heidegger failed to add anything of philosophical substance: "There is an anti-Semitism in Heidegger's thinking that -- as befits a thinker -- undergoes an (impossible) philosophical grounding, but that does not get beyond two or three stereotypes" (87-8). That seems to me exactly right. But then Trawny adds, "The being-historical construction makes it all the worse. It is this which could (könnte) lead to a contamination of this thinking" (88). But how exactly does the "being-historical construction" further exacerbate the already dismal combination of Heidegger's critique of calculative reason and his fear and hatred of the Jews? And why does Trawny say merely that it "could" (subjunctive könnte) rather than that it "was able to" (past indicative konnte) "contaminate" Heidegger's thought? Did it or didn't it?

Of course, even if Heidegger's anti-Semitism does just turn out to be the conventional prejudice already well known both to historians and to the culture at large, one can still ask exactly where and how it figures into Heidegger's thinking. Does the account of the history of being either entail or require an anti-Semitic element? Did Heidegger's anti-Semitism shape and guide his account of the history of being? Does it discredit that account, wholly or in part? If in part, which parts? Regrettably, Trawny's argument never quite rises to that level of specificity. Instead, he earnestly poses, and then leaves hanging, one question after another:

Would rationality as such then be a being-historical invention of the Jews -- or does Heidegger rather grasp Judaism as a form in which "machination" actualizes itself? (22)

The West had fallen prey to machination; the task originating with the Greeks of founding a world in "thinking and poetizing" appeared lost. Why? (35)

Were the National Socialists then actually Germans deceived by "machination," i.e., deceived by the Jews? . . . Do the Protocols [of the Elders of Zion] not suggest the idea that National Socialism itself could have been the most malicious invention of the Jews? (36)

If certain elements of the being-historical narrative are to retain a determinate role from the outset [e.g., "Americanism," "gigantic business"] . . . then is the history of being itself not anti-Semitic? (37)

Was the triumph of technology not the final victory of "world Judaism"? (54)

Why does Heidegger emphasize that the break [with Husserl] would have taken place long before the "talk" of "National Socialism and the persecution of the Jews"? (62)

That last question appears near the end of a chapter on Heidegger's -- philosophically, personally, ethically -- problematic relation to Husserl, and the chapter ends in the same frustratingly inconclusive way: in insisting that he broke with Husserl before there was much talk in Germany of anti-Semitic persecution, "is Heidegger thinking of clandestine conversations, of encounters, in which people expressed their revulsion at the rumors of the camps? Could this all be connected with Husserl? When did Heidegger know of the 'persecution of the Jews'"? (63) The reader is left hanging.

Trawny also regularly avoids direct assertion and argument by falling back on locutions that merely suggest, hint, indicate, insinuate, hypothesize: a particular passage "does not preclude" this (33), "we cannot rule out" that (34), and so on. The book abounds in this kind of tentative suggestion that is, in effect, the declarative equivalent of an unanswered question, a dangling thread.

As I was reading the book, the form of its central question also struck me as strangely inappropriate. The question, Trawny announces at the outset, is "whether and to what extent anti-Semitism contaminates [Heidegger's] philosophy as a whole" (emphasis added). That choice of words was no casual error on Trawny's part. On the contrary, "The concept of 'contamination' is particularly important for what follows," for "The interpretation ventured here . . . seeks to arrive at an answer to the question of how far this contamination reaches and how it is to be delimited" (3). That, it seems to me, is an unfortunate way of framing questions about the substance of Heidegger's (or anyone's) philosophical thought, not just because the metaphor of purity and contamination is awkward or in poor taste in a discussion of racism and genocide, but because it presupposes a categorical judgment: yes or no, pure or impure, clean or soiled, intact or ruined. Like its close relative sin, contamination is the kind of thing there is no good amount of, other than zero. (Try inviting someone to drink water that is somewhat, or even only slightly, "contaminated.")

As it turns out, discomfort with Trawny's reliance on the metaphor of contamination is vindicated in the Afterword to the German Second Edition, in which Trawny himself disavows it, confessing with good-natured irony, "I have even allowed my own thoughts to be 'contaminated'" (101). Although that admission further weakens much of the already tentative, underdeveloped argument of the preceding hundred pages, it also has the happy result of leading Trawny, however belatedly, to acknowledge that the only way to advance the inquiry into the philosophical implications of Heidegger's Nazism and anti-Semitism is to examine the form and content of his philosophy: "It would certainly be desirable if, in the future, the focus fell upon the philosophical problems that we encounter in the Black Notebooks from the end of the 1930s. It seems to me that we are poised for a discussion of Heidegger's radical anti-universalism." (101)

That also seems to me exactly right. Much (not all) of what has been written over the years about Heidegger's Nazism and anti-Semitism is of historical interest, but strictly speaking useless for gaining any insight into exactly how his actions, his fears, his prejudices, his ideological commitments -- his at times solipsistic, delusional fantasies -- figured into his philosophical thinking. The Black Notebooks now provide new material with which we can take such questions seriously, as we must. Trawny's book ends where it should have begun, but it is at least a beginning.

[1] Heidegger, Überlegungen XII, 82. Überlegungen XII-XV, GA 96. P. Trawny, ed. (Klostermann, 2014), 56. Quoted in Trawny, Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy, 19 (translation modified); hereafter Trawny (2015); all unmarked page references in the body of the review are to this book. Unfortunately, Trawny's translator renders Übermächtigung des Lebens in this passage as "overpowering of life," which reverses its meaning: machination does not overwhelm life; it imbues it with superior power (Übermacht).

[2] The first phrase is from Überlegungen II-VI. GA 94. P. Trawny, ed. (Klostermann, 2014), 168; recently published in English as Ponderings II-VI: Black Notebooks 1931-1938, R. Rojcewicz, trans. (Indiana University Press, 2016), 123. The second is from Seminare: Hegel -- Schelling. GA 86. P. Trawny, ed. (Klostermann, 2011), 162; On Hegel's Philosophy of Right: The 1934-35 Seminar and Interpretive Essays. P. Trawny et al., eds. A. J. Mitchell, trans. (Bloomsbury, 2014), 175.

[3] Anmerkungen I-V. GA 97. P. Trawny, ed. (Klostermann, 2015), 20. Quoted in Trawny (2015), 76 (translation modified).

[4] Überlegungen XII, 121. Überlegungen XII-XV, GA 96: 243. Quoted in Trawny (2015), 19.