Heidegger and the Place of Ethics

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Michael Lewis, Heidegger and the Place of Ethics, Continuum, 2005, 232pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826484972.

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University


The primary objective of Heidegger and the Place of Ethics is to show that the ethics of the thing that Heidegger develops in his later work must in fact be understood in relation to a notion of the political. If this is so, it would show that this ethics is not apolitical, as many of Heidegger's critics suggest. In the Preface, Lewis describes his book as the first part of a larger philosophical project whose goal is to bring Heidegger's thought into contact with Marxism. Before this encounter can be staged, it is necessary to show that Heidegger's mature thought has a political dimension, and especially that it involves a critique of ideology (xii). This hypothesis is developed primarily in the conclusion of the book where Lewis suggests that there are important similarities between Žižek's critique of ideology, rooted in a notion of the thing which presents a kind of 'hole' in the Symbolic order, and Heidegger's own thinking of the thing (174-76). In order to reach the point, however, where this similarity between Heidegger and Žižek can be seen, it is necessary for Lewis to establish the place of ethics in Heidegger's thought and its relationship to politics. He claims that the place of ethics is the ontological difference, and that being-with has everything to do with this (1). Thus, he contends that the retention of a notion of being-with in Heidegger's thinking of the ontological difference will enable us to identify a political dimension to the ethics of the thing.

The seven chapters of the book are organized into three parts. Lewis himself states that Part I is concerned with Sein, Part II with Ereignis, and Part III with Gestell (5). The first and longest part focuses on Being and Time, and seeks to establish two main points. The first is that Being and Time simply assumes the ontological difference between being and beings without truly thinking the differentiation between them. As such Being and Time, or the project of fundamental ontology more generally, fails to address the origin or genesis of this difference and thinks being only as Sein. The second claim is that there is a connection between the ontological difference and being-with. In other words this relation between being and beings should be thought as a relation of being with beings (2 im passim). But Heidegger does not grasp this at this stage in his thought and instead conceives of being-with only as Being-with-others. Heidegger's failure to think about the genesis of the ontological difference is linked, it is claimed, to his not having thought being-with primordially enough. The inadequacy of his notion of being-with is illustrated, according to Lewis, by the difficulty Heidegger has understanding being-with within the two-part schema of authenticity and inauthenticity (16-17).

It is not easy to follow the logic of this position, but it seems to depend upon the important claim that the place of ethics is the ontological difference (5). If this is so, and if the place of ethics in Being and Time is authenticity, then authenticity should be the site of the ontological difference, or the ontological difference should occur in Dasein's becoming authentic. That Heidegger's text displays a certain ambivalence toward being-with in relation to authenticity suggests that he does not yet have the right idea of being-with. To help him along, Lewis argues that there is a second form of being-with in conscience (54). Since conscience involves the call of being, Lewis maintains that conscience entails a relation between being and beings and so, a relation of being with beings -- in other words, a thought of being-with that is related to the ontological difference (42). Since conscience plays a role in Dasein's authenticity, this form of being-with is located squarely in the place of ethics, and so we find that authenticity does or could have something to do with being-with and the ontological difference. But the site of this differentiation remains Dasein, and thus occurs within the limits of Dasein's finitude.

Part II explores the alternatives presented by Heidegger in the Beiträge to the understanding of being and of the ontological difference characteristic of fundamental ontology. According to Lewis, "Heidegger's later thought is a thought of being with beings, of the very differentiation of the ontological difference which went unthought in his early work" (2). The Beiträge will correct fundamental ontology by tracing the origin of the ontological difference to Ereignis, and the purpose of Part II is to show how this occurs and how it yields an ethics -- the ethics of the thing. Man will no longer be the privileged site of being's manifestation, and his role will instead shift to being the guardian of the sites of the thing's appearance. Thus, ethics shifts from being a kind of ethics of authenticity to being an ethics of Gelassenheit (70). Since there is no talk of others in Heidegger's later thought, many think that being-with has been discarded, but Lewis wants to show otherwise, building upon the second form of being-with discussed in Part I. Conscience calls when Dasein grasps its own mortality in a confrontation with its own death. By showing that death continues to play a role in the later work, Lewis hopes to show that the new form of being-with is evident there as well (70).

In the later work, the differentiation between being and beings that occurs in Ereignis entails a withdrawal of being through which beings become present. But in modernity, the forgottenness of being is so acute that for us being is nothing, and there are only beings. Death will play a role in the process of breaking through the occlusion of being. This process has three steps, each involving a distinctive Stimmung. The chapters of Part II are structured around these three steps. The first is the disclosure of the void of being in terror (Erschrecken) through the negation or death of beings as a whole (79, 93). This distress at being's withdrawal (95) is followed by a questioning response in restraint (Verhaltenheit). This restraint lets beings be, and "opens it to the possibility that death might show us not just nothing, but being" (96). This moment becomes awe (Scheu) when the withdrawal of being "is determined as a condition of the gift of the whole" (96). These three moments taken together are what Lewis calls the ethics of the thing because the thing is that entity through which being in its withdrawal is intimated (108).

Part III deals with the counter-essence to Ereignis, namely Gestell. There are two particularly important points in this section. First is the claim that if ethics entails a relation to being, then politics is about a relation to beings. So Gestell, as what orders our relation to beings, is construed as political. A fourth mood, horror (Entsetzen), is disclosive of Gestell in that it allows us to see the domination of being by beings (124). What this means is that the disclosure of the politics of Gestell provides a sort of opening for the ethics of the thing. While Lewis only introduces this point in the transition from Part II to Part III, it seems to be important if we are to make sense of his claim that Part III is about Gestell. The second point, which receives more attention in these chapters, is to establish that the ethics of the thing does not entail transcending or overcoming the political, but itself necessitates a moment of the political. That is, there is a relation between the ethics of the thing and politics. The key to this argument lies in the role of the fourfold in the presencing (or thinging) of the thing (118). In the fourfold, the mortals must stand in a particular relation to one another and to the gods before the thing can become present. Thus, a precondition for the appearance of the thing is a certain human plurality or being-with, but such relations are political (126). Thus, there is a political dimension to the ethics of the thing; indeed, "the ethics of the thing … [can] take place only within the political situation of historical time" (119). We here arrive at a position that advances beyond fundamental ontology in that the opening of the ontological difference is no longer located in Dasein, but rather among the mortals and between the mortals and the gods (41-2, 130, 132, 143).

Heidegger and the Place of Ethics is a difficult book in part because its scope is ambitious. One has the sense that Lewis has tried to include everything he has to say about Heidegger into this one book. The result is that the thread of the primary argument sometimes gets lost in the details of tangential discussions. Themes are taken up in sections of the book (for instance, the increased importance of mood as a mode of disclosure in the Beiträge) that are developed at enough length to convince the reader that they are important to the overall thesis, only to fade into insignificance later. So, it is often difficult to identify how exactly the argument proceeds. Lewis seems to recognize this and thankfully includes extensive sections in the text that explain what he is attempting to show in the various chapters or parts. The problem is that it is often difficult to identify the arguments that these sections announce in the text itself. It is as though these sketches of what the argument will be become self-justifying and thus stand in for the argument itself.

Nevertheless, the sections of the text that develop the ethics of the thing are helpful for explaining the complexity of this notion in Heidegger, and the possibility that Heidegger's thought might have a deeper political dimension than initially appears is interesting. Those who are familiar with Žižek's critique that Heidegger's work fails to exhibit anything like a politics of being will find Lewis's book of interest, as will those who are interested in the ethics of the thing or who are working to retrieve a richer conception of the political from Heidegger. However, Part I features a highly idiosyncratic reading of Being and Time. Anyone who is very familiar with Heidegger's early work and who searches for satisfactory arguments to justify this peculiar reading will be frustrated.

The claim that being-with has something to do with the ontological difference looms very large in this book, and frankly, it is an odd claim. Is it really true that being-with is as central to Heidegger's thought as Lewis maintains, and more importantly, does it mean anything like a relation of being with beings? Lewis seems to operate with this idea from the beginning. But what justifies this? In Being and Time being-with is characterized as that aspect of Dasein's being that enables it to be with others. When Heidegger elaborates this idea, he will often refer to the others as those who are there too, and so it makes sense to say that the two ideas, though analytically distinguishable, really go hand in hand: one can only be with the sort of entity that can be disclosed as 'there too'. It is not clear that the 'Being-with-beings', if we can call it that, that is expressed in Being-with-others bears any relation to the ontological difference. At least not on the basis of Heidegger's text.

Lewis recognizes this, which is why he develops the notion of a second form of being-with in conscience. But he must go to extraordinary lengths to make the case that conscience is a second form of being-with (42). These lengths include the imposition of an 'incipient four-fold' schema onto Heidegger's text (37) -- a schema for which no real justification in Heidegger's text can be found. Lewis himself characterizes this tactic as violent (41), which suggests that the position -- if it is indeed intended to be a reading of Heidegger -- is simply implausible. In these sections, it would be more accurate to say that Lewis is thinking beyond Heidegger using Heidegger's concepts and language. However, this is confusing to the reader since the work purports to be exegetical. What I think Lewis is doing is searching for a kind of being-with-the other that becomes instantiated in the form of being-with-others. That is probably a worthy goal; it is doubtful however that Heidegger's text will support this interpretation as Lewis pursues it.

How much damage this does to Lewis's overall thesis about the relation between ethics and politics is not clear because it is not clear how necessary the reading of being-with in Part I is to the position developed later in the book. Obviously, Lewis thinks it is necessary, but it may not be. One could still make the argument on the basis of the later Heidegger alone, and thereby dispense with the strained reading of Being and Time in the beginning.