Heidegger and the Problem of Consciousness

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Nancy J. Holland, Heidegger and the Problem of Consciousness, Indiana University Press, 2018, 132pp., $38.00 (pbk) ISBN 9780253035943.

Reviewed by Joe Balay, Christopher Newport University


The title of Nancy Holland's new study is ambiguous. A book on Heidegger and consciousness? Does the author mean Husserl and consciousness? After all, is Heidegger a thinker of consciousness or one of its most profound critics? Should the reader hear the title as promising an explication of Heidegger's contribution to the longstanding mind/body problem, or as Heidegger's problematization of the very question? This ambiguity constitutes the intrigue of Holland's investigation.

To be clear, Holland's study is aimed at re-thinking the question of consciousness by drawing on the work of Heidegger. Her target is the Cartesian legacy of dualism and the prevailing trend in philosophy to subordinate the mental to the physical. Holland argues that by starting with a materialist monism or dualism, however, one cannot achieve a sufficiently robust account of consciousness and its integration with the physical world. Turning to Heidegger, she contends that it is only with an account of the kind of living, caring being for whom the question of Being exists (Dasein) that what we call nature or the physical first appears as significant.

Holland has two other goals here. First, as a former student of Hubert Dreyfus, she hopes to go beyond Dreyfus's limited concern with Being and Time to give a more systematic interpretation of Heidegger's corpus. Second, she aims to demonstrate a greater continuity in this corpus than has been traditionally recognized. Holland emphasizes that her study is not intended to offer a comprehensive interpretation of Heidegger, engage his affiliation with National Socialism, revere his status in the philosophical canon, or deconstruct him in order to move past him. Rather, she aligns herself with what she calls "a wave of twenty-first century Heidegger scholarship" aimed at applying Heidegger's thought in productive ways to pressing topics like the consciousness problem and the global ecological crisis (5).

Following the introduction, Chapter 2 offers an overview of prevailing approaches to the question of consciousness in contemporary psychology, cognitive science, philosophy of mind, and neurobiology. Drawing in particular on the work of Gerald Edelman and Max Velmans, Holland recognizes two key problems in these mainstream approaches. First, in materialist accounts there continues to be a fundamental inability to articulate how consciousness emerges from the physical, and/or to give a sufficient account of just what consciousness is. In these models, consciousness remains an illusion or epiphenomenon (even if a useful and interesting one), a description that fails to do justice to the complex and significant nature of consciousness. Second, she observes that continuity theories (like Velmans' pnpsychism) do not solve the problem; instead, in arguing that the physical and mental have always co-existed, they simply push the problem back. There is little reason then to prefer one of these solutions to the other.

On Holland's view, these theoretical shortcomings are the inevitable inheritance of a Cartesian legacy and techno-scientific way of framing the question of consciousness. She proposes that, "such a difficulty arises, however, only where one starts with dualism and works backwards, . . . rather than starting with lived experience and moving outward" (20). Chapter 3 commences Holland's attempt to reconstruct Heidegger's solution to this problem, approaching the task chronologically, beginning with Towards the Definition of Philosophy (1919) and his early interpretations of Aristotle. Holland emphasizes Heidegger's critique of scientism and biologism in these texts, a critique that she argues connects his early work with the more explicit treatment of techno-science in later texts like "The Question Concerning Technology" (1954). In particular, she observes that the ground of Heidegger's critique of materialist ontologies is already found here in the recognition that "things as things cannot be 'there' for a consciousness if minds are merely one kind of object among others" (27). Rather, a world first emerges with the pre-theoretical comportment of a conscious being (Dasein) that thematizes it with pragmatic concerns.

Holland observes that Heidegger distinguishes himself from Husserlian intentionality and the trap of idealism in these early texts. For Heidegger, a meaningful world does not appear for a singular transcendental "I" through the polarization of subject/object relations, but for an embodied, social, lived experience relationally situated in language and always already out-in-the-world. Nor can one circumvent this facticity with the critique that language itself is an abstraction. For Heidegger, a theoretical conception of language is derivative from its pre-theoretical, pragmatic manner of being-towards-the-world in everyday dealings (29). This means that while lived experience can become the basis for the study of nature, wherein one adopts a secondary, theoretical attitude about a specific region of Being, "it cannot itself be the direct object of such study" (29). That is, "a science of consciousness is impossible, not because consciousness exists outside of nature or because it is an epiphenomenon of natural processes, but because once consciousness becomes an object of study, it is no longer consciousness" (29).

Chapters 4-6 highlight Heidegger's ontological re-conception of truth, which Holland recognizes as the heart of her argument (60). Drawing first on Heidegger's Sophist lectures (1924-25) and Logic: The Question of Truth (1925-26), Holland shows how Heidegger's thinking about truth is irreducible to the traditional correspondence view. This is because Heidegger retrieves the ancient Greek notion of truth as aletheia, translated as unconcealment or disclosure. As Holland notes, aletheia is irreducible to a realist conception of truth (e.g. real gold) as well as a subjectivist account of truth as judgment (e.g. I believe that it is real gold). Rather, aletheia names the ontological event between a being concerned with the significance of beings and the manifest emergence of those beings. As Holland notes, in this event Dasein "discloses a world of entities that would simply be undifferentiated 'stuff' unless we encountered them" (42). For Heidegger then, it is only against this primordial background that one can subsequently situate representational paradigms in which a derivative correspondence conception of truth applies.

De-emphasizing the place of Being and Time in Heidegger's thought and moving on to The Basic Problems of Phenomenology (1927), Holland further develops Heidegger's anti-idealist re-conception of intentionality. She illustrates this with an example of looking at a tree that strongly echoes Merleau-Ponty's famous citation of artists like André Marchand and Paul Klee. Holland observes

I can look out my window at the tree to gauge how strong the wind is prior to walking home . . . However, my perception of the tree is not the act of a self-subsistent consciousness but is, in the first place, pre-personal (i.e., when I turn my gaze is necessarily grasped by the movement of the branches). (58)

The argument here is that it is only from this pre-personal, ontological revision of intentionality that one may subsequently derive conceptions of self, object, and concerted projects or goals. As opposed to existentialists like Sartre, Holland explains that

For Heidegger, our relation to nature starts not with subjects and objects, but with a holistic perceptual experience based in a meaningful social world and geared toward action -- an empty directedness we are taught to label in various ways as we are taught the options for filling it -- out of which the mental and the physical are later abstracted. (57)

Turning to Heidegger's later thinking about the historicity of Being, the ancient Greeks, and technology, Holland emphasizes the way that an "ontological claim is interwoven with this epistemological one" in the event of aletheia (78). Holland explains that whereas truth is typically regarded as an epistemic concept, in Heidegger's appropriation of the ancient Greek use of aletheia, truth is ontological; it is an event of Being. This is because what is unconcealed as present is Being for the Greeks. In moving beyond the Greeks to consider this event of disclosure itself, however, Heidegger recognizes that the essence of truth turns out to be untruth. This is because concealment is the state out of which unconcealment always occurs, and back to which it always threatens to return. This primordial relation of ontological truth and untruth is the condition for the possibility then of all derivative conceptions of falsity and error. Moreover, Heidegger argues that the onto-theological interpretation of Being according to the model of beings and a drive for certainty characterizes the special kind of untruth that he calls 'errancy'. This is the historical effacement of aletheia itself, culminating in our techno-scientific misunderstanding of both Being and ourselves today.

Following this question of errancy, Holland concludes her argument by showing how Heidegger's later exploration of technology retrieves his earliest concerns with scientism and the dangers of materialism in Towards the Definition of Philosophy (1919). Specifically, Holland notes that, for Heidegger, the present epoch is one in which the event of aletheia is so restricted to the pre-determined model of the world prescribed by techno-science that, 1) we come to believe this is the only way that the world can be disclosed, and 2) Dasein-consciousness is itself understood in these materialist terms. In this way, Holland reads Heidegger as exposing the underlying historical story of how the Western tradition comes to arrive at the materialist/dualist misconception(s) of consciousness.

The final two chapters offer a brief reflection on how Holland understands her own interpretation of Heidegger in relation to influential interpretations offered by figures such as Dreyfus, Thomas Sheehan, Richard Capobianco, and Jacques Derrida. In particular, Holland contends that her project improves on Dreyfus's failure to critically appreciate the full body of Heidegger's corpus, developing what remains only adumbrated in Dreyfus. She sees her project as correcting a tendency to over-humanize and epistemologize Heidegger in accounts aiming to "make sense" of Heidegger (e.g. Sheehan) (102). Rather, like Capobianco elsewhere, Holland insists on a comprehensive emphasis on the question of Being in Heidegger's thought.

As the foregoing suggests, Holland navigates a large body of Heidegger's key texts with a rare combination of concision, clarity, and attention to its radical nuance. On the whole, it is hard not to appreciate her interpretation of Heidegger as careful, astute, and largely convincing. The book is especially praiseworthy for its recovery of the ontological priority of Heidegger's work, and its resistance to more recent humanist and deflationary, pragmatist readings. Indeed, what is perhaps most methodologically striking about is the book's  dialogue with thinkers across the various waves, approaches, and divides of Heidegger scholarship. Holland engages with figures associated with all sides of these debates, and her work constitutes a genuine solicitation for dialogue going forward.

This methodological virtue, however, overlaps my primary critical discomfiture with the book. This is found in the title and underlying goal of the project itself. It is simply strange to suggest that Heidegger is a thinker of consciousness. Despite Holland's incisive reconstruction of what one might otherwise call consciousness through Dasein, there are very good reasons that Heidegger strategically avoids the term and concept in his work. In the introduction to her study here, Holland pauses for a moment to discuss the terms "physical" and "consciousness" (6-9). She observes that while the former is deeply problematic for Heidegger because his appropriation of the ancient Greek notion of physis is fundamentally different than the understanding of terms like nature and the physical today, she is comfortable using the terms mental, consciousness, and psyche interchangeably because they still resonate with many of the same questions surrounding their ancient Greek treatment. I suspect, however, that Heidegger would disagree.

Of course, the primary reason that Heidegger avoids the term consciousness is the same reason that Holland finds his work most appealing. Heidegger's project is, first and foremost, aimed at the question of Being, not consciousness or epistemology. To this end, Heidegger aggressively distinguishes himself from Husserl and the preceding Western tradition within which the discourse of consciousness is tied to a subject/object dualism and logocentric rationality. As Holland notes, Heidegger's earlier conception of Dasein and later discussions of the clearing of Being signify a much more complex ontological dynamic than consciousness traditionally understood. One wonders then why we ought to recover the concept of consciousness for Heidegger's thinking?

Allow me to illustrate my point with one example from Holland's study. Explicating the equiprimordial features of Dasein from Being and Time -- Understanding, Discourse, and Attunement -- Holland observes that the latter helps subvert the subjective understanding of consciousness by holding Dasein out into the nothing in which all subject/object relations collapse (61). Thus whereas the philosophy of emotion typically sits at the borders of philosophical accounts of consciousness today, Heidegger's understanding of attunement explodes such borders. However, attunement remains important in Heidegger's later work for understanding how the work of art and technology help tune the disclosure of an epoch, as well as for his thinking of letting-be (Gelassenheit) (67-68). In this later discourse, attunement does not simply subvert subjectivity, however; it belongs to an anonymous ontological event irreducible to subject/object, consciousness/non-consciousness, Dasein/being(s). But if consciousness is not only subverted, but eclipsed by ontology, why continue appealing to this discourse? Indeed, might doing so risk re-inscribing Heidegger in the very tradition that he deconstructs?

Alternatively, one might suggest that Heidegger's work approaches a kind of post-consciousness discourse looking forward to postmodernism. Perhaps this is to go too far. In any case, it seems necessary to explain why Heidegger brackets this concept in his own work, and why, as a critical audience, we should recover it. This kind of preliminary hermeneutic exposition is necessary to clear the space for such terminological violence. In the end, however, this is more than a concern about consciousness. It belongs to Holland's broader methodological hope for a rapprochement between competing ways of reading Heidegger today. If the goal of Holland's book is to put Heidegger into dialogue with analytic debates regarding the mind/body problem, then she convincingly succeeds. If the goal is an engagement with Heidegger scholars of a more continental bent, then the gesture may appear more problematic given the foregoing reservation. This is the challenge of the so-called "new wave" of Heidegger scholarship. Holland's study is an incisive and provocative call to this challenge.