Heidegger and Theology

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Judith Wolfe, Heidegger and Theology, Bloomsbury, 2014, 242pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780567033765.

Reviewed by Matthew C. Halteman, Calvin College


In advising students on navigating the wilds of Heidegger scholarship, I provisionally characterize the field as encompassing work that falls at various places along four main spectra. There's the archival/conceptual spectrum, which spans the divide between mining raw materials from unpublished manuscripts and constructing and defending theories of, say, non-mentalistic intentionality or authenticity. There's the booster/detractor spectrum, stretched taut between Heidegger's faithful acolytes on one side and his virulent critics on the other. There's the historical/contemporary spectrum, which unfolds between explaining what mattered to Heidegger and his interlocutors, on one hand, and adapting their problems, methods, and insights to present-day concerns on the other. And there's the pragmatism/mysticism spectrum, along which Heidegger's work is framed, at the near end, primarily in terms of his "early" emphasis on coping resolutely with the anxiety of finite existence, and, at the far end, primarily in terms of his "later" emphasis on "letting beings be" -- mindfully releasing the world from our rapacious reduction of it to consumable resources.

There is good work to do across each spectrum, and I don't want to suggest that finding the mean is a virtue in all (or even most) cases. But when a slim, winsomely-written introductory volume manages accessibly to survey many of the most important signposts across Heidegger's path, does so in a way that both excavates new sources and puts them to constructive use, is historically-informed but futurally-minded and generous but critical -- that's an achievement. What's more, Judith Wolfe accomplishes these things while illuminating the rich but underemphasized hermeneutic significance for Heidegger's work of his lifelong struggle to reconcile himself to the Christian moorings of his life and thought.

Heidegger dramatically characterized this struggle in 1937/38 as having "affected the whole path of my questioning like subterranean, seismic shocks":

And who should fail to recognize that my entire path so far has been accompanied by a silent engagement with Christianity: an engagement that has never taken the form of an explicitly raised "problem," but was rather at once the preservation of my ownmost provenance -- the childhood house, home, and youth -- and a painful emancipation from it.[1]

In remarkably short and lucid order, Wolfe articulates both an "explicitly raised problem" in view of which to frame this silent engagement -- "the importance of eschatology as an abiding category of Heidegger's thought both in relation to theology and in general" (197) -- and an assiduous chronicle of the effects of its tremors across Heidegger's path.

The term "eschatology" in Christian theology refers to inquiry about "last things" or ends, both in the senses of "end" as "final cessation" and as "guiding purpose." Its purview includes questions about how the end of the fallen world has or will come to pass in Christ's redemptive work and how human beings ought to live as they anticipate and participate in the coming eschaton -- the final fruition, both of their own lives and of the world at large. In positioning eschatology at the heart of Heidegger's project, Wolfe situates his sustained six-decade critique of Western philosophy as an engagement with the deepest questions concerning the spiritual ends of humankind, the world, and the philosophical discourses with which we make our way in it. These questions first became urgent for Heidegger, Wolfe reminds us, in his own religious life and work, and given his guiding conviction that "one's origin always remains one's future," the formative theological framing of these questions thrust upon him by his "ownmost provenance" could not help but continue to shape his philosophical development (1).

From his earliest anti-modern polemics in German Catholic "newspaper wars" (11), to his turn to Protestants like Luther and Kierkegaard for accounts of religious experience adequate to the struggles of daily life, to his strident efforts to segregate putatively fundamental ontological philosophy from merely ontic theology, to his later attempts to overcome ontotheological metaphysics through an "apophatic eschatology" (143), Wolfe argues persuasively that Heidegger's philosophical journey is animated throughout by deep engagement with Christian theological reflection on cosmic and human ends. On Wolfe's account, this engagement is congenial and agonistic in turns, but always provocative -- both of Heidegger's most abiding philosophical concerns and, thus, of the careful interdisciplinary attention of philosophers and theologians working in his wake.

The book is composed of an introduction and eight chapters. The first six chapters guide the reader through a (mostly) chronological survey of the periods of Heidegger's career as construed through the lens of his theological engagements and their impact on the evolution of his thought: Heidegger's Catholicism (1889-1915); Heidegger's Protestantism (1916-1921); The emancipation of philosophy (1921-1929); Theology in Being and Time; Heidegger between Hitler and Hölderlin (1930-1935); and The later Heidegger (1935 and beyond). The exception to the chronological rule is chapter 4, in which Wolfe leverages helpful discussions from chapter 3 of insights gleaned from letters and texts written in the immediate wake of Being and Time to illuminate Heidegger's magnum opus. With the full sweep of his thought path in view, Wolfe devotes two remaining chapters to mapping Heidegger's theological reception among his contemporaries (chapter 7, Heidegger among theologians) and in contemporary theology more broadly (chapter 8, Heidegger in theology).

Those familiar with Wolfe's previous book, Heidegger's Eschatology: Theological Horizons in Martin Heidegger's Early Work[2] (HE), will notice significant overlap in the ground covered by Heidegger and Theology (HT). About half of HT -- the first four chapters -- is repurposed from HE via revision and abridgment of the more specialized material. The second half of HT extends the scope of HE's research program into new work on Heidegger's path after 1930 and his theological reception. This strategy enables Wolfe both to convert the specialized research of HE into a more accessible, faster-paced narrative and to illuminate the work of Heidegger's middle and later periods -- work that is both politically notorious and conceptually difficult -- by drawing it into the light of this helpful narrative arc. The result is a work that can be appreciated by both Heidegger experts and scholars and students of twentieth-century European philosophy and Christian theology.

Scholars will appreciate that Wolfe has prioritized, when possible, the use of new source materials to make her case and that she deemphasizes texts and debates that are beaten tracks in Heidegger scholarship (cf. 5, 47, 194). For those wishing to explore these source materials in detail, Wolfe provides an impressive set of research aids that demonstrates both expansive knowledge of the original language sources and enviable technical skill, right down to reading Kierkegaard in Danish (79). Of the book's 242 pages, 90 are devoted to extensive notes, bibliographical materials, and an index replete with surnames that only the guild's fustiest archivists will recognize. By keeping the bracing narrative of Heidegger's engagement with theology in the foreground, however, and the scholarly apparatus on which it is framed largely behind the scenes, Wolfe succeeds in maintaining readability without compromising rigor.

Speaking of readability, students will appreciate Wolfe's commitment to the view that "Heidegger's philosophy retains much of its cogency in ordinary English," (7) thus sparing them idiosyncratic translations that attempt to retain German etymologies lost on English-speaking readers. Also helpful to newcomers is Wolfe's discipline, before plunging into a dense patch of exposition or argumentation, of briefly summarizing important background information with which some readers may be unfamiliar. So those coming from Heidegger to theology get a primer on traditional Christian accounts of sin and death before learning how these figure into Heidegger's discussions of fallenness and authenticity (62-64).

Those coming from theology to Heidegger will find cutting-edge resources for understanding his personal and professional theological engagements and their importance for the development of his work, as well as for tracing his influence on important strands of twentieth-century theology. The range of theological inputs that figure into Wolfe's narrative is remarkable. It encompasses, among others, papal encyclicals declaring modernism "the synthesis of all heresies" (11), the Catholic Tübingen School's forays into German Idealism and Romanticism (19), Schleiermacher's "proto-phenomenological conception of religion as a 'disposition' or 'form of experience'" (39), the work of the tradition's standout figures like St. Paul, Augustine, Luther, and Kierkegaard on the vigilance (49), restlessness (51), affliction (43), and anxiety (73) of living in fallen anticipation of redemption, Hölderlin's emphasis on "suffering as the initial condition of the coming (or return) of god" (107), Bultmann's liberalism, Barth's dialectical theology, Stein's Thomist-inflected recalibration of phenomenology (chapters 7-8), and "lifelong friendships" with Benedictine monks cultivated during "long stays" at St. Martin Abbey in Beuron (158).

Resources like these are not overabundant even in the specialized literature (which is well canvassed in Wolfe's bibliography), and they are especially rare in the supporting literature for non-experts and students. More concretely, just one essay out of more than sixty chapters on offer in the relevant Blackwell[3] and Cambridge[4] companions provides in-depth coverage of Heidegger and theology, and that essay dates from the early nineties[5], well before some of the sources that Wolfe consults were available even in German.[6]

Heidegger's theologically-minded readership is bound to find this boon of resources exciting. But Wolfe is careful to show that readers previously uninterested in or unaware of the theological undercurrents in Heidegger's work can profit from them too, insofar as they inform the pivotal themes of his philosophy. As Wolfe tells the story, Heidegger's initial gravitation away from neo-Scholasticism (17), his discovery of phenomenology (33), and the development of his treatments of lived experience, anxiety, authenticity, being-unto-death, temporality, and mindfulness all bear the indelible marks of a philosophical imagination stoked, labored, and even tormented, by theologically-inflected eschatological questions.

The character of this philosophically-generative spiritual struggle is captured vividly in Wolfe's citation of a 1947 reflection by Max Müller, Heidegger's friend and a prominent Catholic theologian: "Heidegger is an immensely deep, but torn and tormented man who cannot tear the fishhook of God . . . from his flesh, though this hook is often a torment to him. This may explain why he hates the church as often and as passionately as he loves it" (135). Wolfe's knack for ferreting out just the right juicy bit from the dusty stacks to spotlight the factical ground from which Heidegger's big ideas spring is one of the most compelling features of her approach. In an online interview about HT, she says "I love both detective work in archives and very abstract thought, so perhaps the most fun thing about writing this book was the chance to see what light they throw on each other."[7]

The light is bright, and Wolfe's enjoyment in casting it is clear throughout. The citation of a few key passages at length will give prospective readers a clearer sense both of the narrative's conceptual contours and of Wolfe's style.

Here is Wolfe on the three stages of Heidegger's early "de-theologizing" of eschatology:

The first stage . . . was to prioritize the earliest, eschatologically oriented Christian experience as capable of disclosing the deepest structures of existence, namely eschatological affliction or anxiety. This prioritization consistently comes with a critique of Christianity as quickly abandoning its earliest eschatological experience for secure philosophical and political systems (represented in Heidegger's own time by neo-Scholasticism). The second stage is a more systematic 'deconstruction' of these systems through the postulate of a constitutive and absolute rift between God and man -- a rift that perpetuates affliction of anxiety as the proper mood both of human existence and of theological inquiry. In this emphasis, Heidegger draws on the anti-metaphysical tradition in Christianity, especially St. Paul, Augustine, Martin Luther, Søren Kierkegaard, Franz Overbeck, and Fyodor Dostoevsky: theologians who think that the arrogation of a God's-eye view of human existence is a basic betrayal of the true Christian condition, a hubristic 'theology of glory'. Ironically, however, the radical externality of God, for Heidegger, comes to imply that God's agency must remain irretrievably beyond the purview of the phenomenological method: what originally attracted Heidegger as a method adequate to describing Christian faith now emerges as a demarcation of the philosopher's territory against that of the theologian. The third stage, then, is the emancipation of philosophy from theology as an independent mediatrix of authentic existence (61-62).

She goes on to explain how this emphasis on individual authentic existence that emerges from Being and Time gets politicized into a notorious call for national resolution and struggle under the Nazi regime:

in the early 1930s, Heidegger's de-theologized eschatology began to intersect with an eschatological consciousness that had shaped German self-understanding since the Romantic era, and was also being appropriated by Nazi leaders and intellectuals. However, though Heidegger temporarily thought to be finding in Nazism a spiritual ally -- a movement bold enough to realize the intellectual ambition he was projecting -- he was soon disappointed by the crass, militant apocalypticism into which the eschatological tradition of Fichte, Hegel, and Hölderlin was here being shaped, and dissociated himself from the party programme in favour of an apophatic eschatology centered on a very different reading of Hölderlin (101).

I must leave the reader in suspense on the details of this reading, but I will say that Wolfe's account of Heidegger's Nazism and the unique fusion of hermeneutic insight and archival sleuthing exemplified therein were highlights for me. Her reading of Heidegger's drift from the disastrous political resoluteness of the early thirties to his later emphasis on mindfulness is the most illuminating short treatment I've seen, especially when read alongside a follow-up article she wrote for Standpoint Magazine on the much-discussed Black Notebooks (in part to incorporate newly-available corroborating evidence for her view from the notebooks, which were not yet published when she wrapped HT).[8]

As for Heidegger's "ascetic philosophy of mindfulness," Wolfe has this to say:

Although [it] may be useful in recalling theologians to neglected strands within their own tradition, it is by no means news: non-metaphysical approaches to God exhibiting certain analogies to Heidegger's quasi-mystical vision have been present in the Christian tradition since its beginnings, not least in Origen, Gregory of Nyssa, Pseudo-Dionysius, Maximus the Confessor, John Scotus Eriugena and Meister Eckhart. At best, then, an analogical or associative reading of Heidegger's later philosophy can serve the theologian as a focusing lens on internal Christian resources, while at worst, it may be a skewed lens on those resources. (194)

Wolfe has clearly taken care in this short book both to keep her promises modest and to deliver on them. The book is a pleasure to read and serious weaknesses are hard to find. As always, there are limitations. Not all of the work is new -- much of it is drawn from a previous book. But Wolfe's legitimate interest in mobilizing this research for wider audiences and her extension of the thesis to illuminate Heidegger's later work justify the remix. Her coverage of contemporary theology and suggestions for moving forward are relatively brisk, but Wolfe's pledges to sketch "rough intellectual maps" and to suggest "generative lines of enquiry" are well enough met (151). Finally, there is inevitably a good source or two in Heidegger's theological trove that escapes treatment on which I'd have enjoyed reading Wolfe's take. My favorite omission is Heidegger's deconstruction of "theological transcendence" in the 1928 lecture course The Metaphysical Foundations of Logic, after which -- in a long footnote -- he refuses to develop the account further due to "the enormously phony religiosity" of the current academic climate. He adds,

It is preferable to put up with the cheap accusation of atheism, which, if it is intended ontically, is in fact completely correct. But might not the presumably ontic faith in God be at bottom godlessness? And might the genuine metaphysician be more religious than the usual faithful, than the members of a "church" or even than the "theologians" of every confession?[9]

If Wolfe has left me wondering how this particular favorite passage might have played into her narrative, she has also so enriched my knowledge of its milieu and my understanding of its philosophical spirit that I can practically see the "church," name the "theologians," and feel the anxiety of the would-be "genuine metaphysician" whose ownmost provenance simply wouldn't let him go.


I am grateful to Judith Wolfe for helpful correspondence about some questions I had while preparing the review. Thanks are due as well to my former students Hannah Scanlon and Klaas Walhout for reading Heidegger and Theology and sharing their impressions.

[1] Martin Heidegger, "Mein bisheriger Weg" (1937/38); published posthumously in GA 66, 411-28; 415. Cited in Heidegger and Theology at 136.

[2] Judith Wolfe, Heidegger's Eschatology: Theological Horizons in Martin Heidegger's Early Work, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013.

[3] Hubert L. Dreyfus and Mark A. Wrathall, eds., A Companion to Heidegger, Blackwell, 2005.

[4] Charles B. Guignon, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger, Second Edition, Cambridge University Press, 2006; and Mark A. Wrathall, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger's Being and Time, Cambridge University Press, 2013.

[5] John D. Caputo, "Heidegger and Theology," in The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger, Cambridge University Press, 1993.

[6] One student-friendly source that Wolfe does not cite, but that provides helpful resources for tapping into the Heidegger and theology connection that are sourced from research in the original German texts is Bret W. Davis's unique piece "Heidegger on Christianity and divinity: a chronological compendium," in Bret W. Davis, ed., Martin Heidegger, Acumen, 2010.

[7] Read the interview in its entirety.

[8] Judith Wolfe, "Black Notebooks: Caught in the trap of his own metaphysics," Standpoint, June 2014.

[9] Martin Heidegger, The Metaphysical Foundations of Logic, trans. Michael Heim, Indiana University Press, 1984, 165, note 9.