Heidegger and Unconcealment: Truth, Language, and History

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Mark Wrathall, Heidegger and Unconcealment: Truth, Language, and History, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 250pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521739122.

Reviewed by Stephan Käufer, Franklin & Marshall College


This volume collects eight previously published and two new essays Mark Wrathall has written on the topics of truth, language, and history in the work of the later Heidegger. This body of work is an astonishing achievement. Wrathall's writing is clear and comprehensive, ranging across virtually all of Heidegger's collected works. The essays are full of illuminating examples and draw with equal expertise on the history of philosophy and the literary and religious contexts that inform Heidegger's writing. Wrathall's overall interpretation of Heidegger's work is crystal clear, compelling, and relevant. Every philosopher interested in Heidegger should read this book.

Wrathall's work provides a much need roadmap to Heidegger's later work. "Later Heidegger" refers to views worked out after Being and Time. Beginning in the 1930s Heidegger no longer focuses on the phenomenology of individual existence. Instead, he turns to broader themes about the history of being, i.e., the different ways humans have experienced the being of entities, the nature of language, and the receding role of the divine in our technological age. Around the same time Heidegger also adopts novel styles of doing philosophy. He interprets paintings, poetry, and the pre-Socratics, and he often ventures poetical uses of language in his own writing. For almost half a century he produces essays, talks, letters, dialogues, and lecture notes, but no real book that sums up his views.

Clear philosophical interpretations of "early Heidegger," in particular of Being and Time, have been available for more than two decades now, and a generation of interpreters has produced excellent scholarship on Heidegger's existential analytic and its implications for the philosophy of mind, cognitive science, the philosophy of perception, and related fields. Later Heidegger, however, has largely resisted fruitful interpretations. In part this is because Heidegger's topics are so broad and abstract, and because he frequently uses language in unconventional ways. Further, the lack of a single, sustained authoritative text requires scholars to piece together a view from lecture notes and essays. Most significantly, there are some basic misunderstandings that impede progress towards successful interpretations. One reason why Wrathall's essays are so important is that he patiently and convincingly clears up some of these basic misunderstandings.

The first of these has to do with the "turning." Heidegger himself uses this word to characterize the shift in his philosophy from the existential analytic to the history of being. Reading too much into this "turning" has undermined the sense of continuity between the early and the later work and reinforced the impression that while Being and Time is at grips with fairly standard philosophical concerns, the later Heidegger is pursuing something different and mysterious, such as a cultural history or a substitute for religion.

Wrathall's sustained focus on unconcealment makes clear just how much continuity there is between Heidegger's early and later work. Heidegger uses this term as a translation of the Greek alêtheia in his analyses of logos and truth in Being and Time, and he returns to it many times in his later work. Most importantly, unconcealment is not merely one concern or topic among many that Heidegger continues to be interested in, but, as Wrathall rightly emphasizes, it is a notion that gathers and organizes Heidegger's philosophical thoughts throughout his career. "In my view," Wrathall writes, "Heidegger's thought develops less in starts and stops and dramatic turnings, and more as a gradual recognition of the implications of pursuing an ontology of unconcealment." (p. 4)

An ontology of unconcealment here means a description and analysis of the broad contexts in which entities show up as meaningful to us, as well as the conditions under which such contexts, or worlds, emerge and fade. The existential analytic of Being and Time, thus, is an ontology of unconcealment, insofar as it works out the conditions of intelligibility of entities such as the famous hammer. Heidegger's later views about the history or epochs of being, or about the role of technology, art, and the divine in structuring the intelligibility of the world, also articulate an ontology of the meaningfulness of entities and worlds and hence operate within the same conceptual frame.

As Wrathall convincingly demonstrates, then, unconcealment turns out to be the fundamental notion that binds together Heidegger's early and late philosophy and provides the proper perspective for attempts to understand the later work. Most philosophers who have addressed Heidegger's notion of unconcealment, however, have failed to recognize its importance, or even to understand what Heidegger means by it. Ever since a critique by Ernst Tugendhat in the early 1960s, unconcealment has mostly been seen as an untenable mistake that Heidegger made in his analysis of truth. This is the second basic misunderstanding that Wrathall clears up in this book.

As mentioned above, Heidegger introduces the term unconcealment (Unverborgenheit) as a translation for the Greek alêtheia. This is usually translated as truth, and for the most part philosophers have understood it in the context of propositional truth. Heidegger embraces that context, since he aims to explain the truth of propositions in terms of his views about unconcealment. However, it goes against the grain of theories of propositional truth to claim that there is a truth of entities and that there is a truth of being as such. Heidegger, however, does discuss the unconcealment of entities and being, thus stretching the concept of truth beyond its typical application to propositions. He points out that his use of the word is unusual and that he is targeting an "originary" concept of truth, from which the traditional truth concept derives. Tugendhat's critique, which has subsequently been taken up by others, asserts that Heidegger stretches the concept too far. In particular, Tugendhat argues that an account of the concept of truth must also provide an explanation of falsity, or the failure of truth. Heidegger's notion of unconcealment, however, does not address any such failure to unconceal, and hence cannot be counted as a notion of truth at all. This criticism is bolstered by Paul Friedländer's research showing that alêtheia carries the sense of propositional truth even in early Greek texts, undermining Heidegger's supposition that the Greeks had a more "originary" experience of unconcealment. Heidegger himself seems to acknowledge that he has made a mistake. In his talk "The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking," he states that "the question about aletheia, about unconcealment as such, is not the question about truth. It was inadequate and hence misleading to call aletheia, in the sense of the clearing, truth."

All of this adds up to the impression that whatever Heidegger was pursuing with his notion of originary unconcealment turned out to be untenable and that he consequently abandoned it. If, however, unconcealment is the basic conceptual frame of Heidegger's later thought on truth, language, and history, then this impression thoroughly misleads attempts to interpret that thought. Wrathall is thus especially careful to dissect the various ways in which the Tugendhat critique fails to hit its target. Most importantly, it is crucial to Heidegger's analysis that propositional truth is a comparatively narrow phenomenon. It is an example of unconcealment, insofar as propositions articulate features of the world and thus make them salient and available for our comportment. However, propositions are not the only way to bring relevant features of the world into salience. Heidegger is concerned to argue that for the most part we experience such features in propositionally indeterminate ways. He wants to use the word "truth" precisely in order to draw philosophical attention to such broader phenomena of uncovering. While this usage might be misleading to an audience that insists on propositional truth as a basic philosophical phenomenon, it can nevertheless be motivated by the fact that in colloquial usage a lot of things besides propositions are called "true" and that the philosophical preference for propositional truth is by no means necessary, natural, obvious, or uncontestable. Heidegger's own motivation for broadening the term lies in his penchant for what Wrathall calls the "philosophical use" of key terms, in which they are used to draw attention to phenomena that are covered up by ordinary usage.

One interpretation of Heidegger's later philosophy that is especially indebted to the presumption of the turning and of the Tugendhat-style critique is linguistic constitutionalism. According to this interpretation one of the main tenets of Heidegger's later philosophy is that the being or intelligibility of entities depends on the language we use to refer to them and talk about them. Among other things, this view is supposed to make sense of Heidegger's famous phrase that language is the "house of being." Wrathall develops a clear, detailed and devastating rejection of linguistic constitutionalism as an interpretation of Heidegger's work. He shows that it relies on a superficial reading of selected passages, while ignoring much of Heidegger's own commentary on those passages. It turns out that Heidegger clearly and repeatedly rejects linguistic constitutionalism as a superficially attractive but completely untenable view. He occasionally uses it as a foil to develop his own contrasting view that entities are determined in a stable set of relationships between things and our practices.

Besides a commitment to a radical reversal in the supposed "turning" (in Being and Time Heidegger is clearly and uncontestably not a linguistic constitutionalist), and a dismissal of unconcealment as the basic conceptual structure of Heidegger's writings on language, this interpretation also requires a certain narrow-mindedness about what Heidegger means by "language." Astonishingly, given its supposedly fundamental role in constituting the things that make up our world, and given, too, the vast amount of complex and obscure discussion Heidegger devotes to the very question "what is language," proponents of this view take it as obvious that Heidegger here means a vocabulary-cum-grammar complex. But this is far from obvious and an adequate interpretation requires sensitivity to the nuances of Heidegger's attempts to try and frame the relevant phenomena at various times. Heidegger analyzes language throughout his career, under different titles. Wrathall masterfully traces the development of his view, while underscoring the basic commonality between Heidegger's analyses of discourse (Rede) in Being and Time and language (Sprache) and saying (Sage) in his later work.

I have pointed out some of Wrathall's deep criticisms of entrenched mistakes in the literature on later Heidegger. By themselves these criticisms already make this a very important book that substantially advances scholarship on later Heidegger. However, the positive achievements of this book are even more impressive. Throughout Wrathall exhibits exceptional insight into the subtleties of Heidegger's thought. He provides good translations and examples, and above all he is able to render and explain the substance of Heidegger's claims that are elusive even in the original. For example, to capture the substance of his view on truth as unconcealment, Heidegger appeals to the etymology of "truth" and "essence" and forges phrases such as "the essence of truth is the truth of essencing." And to organize his analysis of the structure of world-disclosure in our technological age, Heidegger formulates the "fourfold," in which earth, sky, mortals, and gods intertwine. These, and similarly obscure phrases, have posed substantial interpretative challenges and reinforced the view that the later Heidegger deals in mysticism, not philosophy. In Wrathall's thoughtful analysis Heidegger's phrases turn into clear and compelling views on the conditions of the intelligibility of our world. "Essencing" refers to the ways in which our practices stabilize and maintain relationships between entities so that they can become salient in our engagement. And the fourfold, refreshingly, should be taken quite literally as the conditions for leading meaningful lives given by the environment, celestial cycles, growth and mortality, and the experiences of the sacred.

The same fine phenomenological sensibility also shines in Wrathall's interpretation of perceptual errors. Cases such as optical illusions, or simply seeing something in a mistaken way, provide familiar and compelling examples of our meaningful engagement with the world that is not yet propositionally determinate. Misperceptions do not consist of false propositional content, because they do not have propositional content at all. In perception we take up a bodily attitude towards the object of perception in the context of some purposive worldly project. Misperceptions consist of attitudes that do not enable us to achieve the goals in terms of which we have the perception in the first place. Since Heidegger's analyses of perception are few and short, Wrathall here goes significantly beyond Heidegger and draws on Merleau-Ponty in arguing that perceptual failures are best explained in terms of practical success conditions, unlike those of beliefs.

There are many more instances of rich examples and fascinating discussion in these essays. As I said above, every philosopher interested in Heidegger should read this book. It is an outstanding and inspiring guide through Heidegger's later work.