Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity

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Iain D. Thomson, Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 245pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521172493.

Reviewed by Lee Braver, Hiram College


Heidegger is the focal point of the history of continental philosophy. He gathers together the movements before him -- transcendental idealism, existentialism, phenomenology, hermeneutics -- and profoundly influences those that follow -- post-structuralism, the Frankfurt school, postmodernism. It is the last of these that Iain Thomson writes about in his excellent new book, Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity, using the topic of art to mutually illuminate Heidegger's later writings and postmodernity. More than just tracing a line of influence, Thomson uses Heidegger's later work to critique certain problematic aspects of postmodernism (i.e., the philosophical movement) which can then provide a "meaningful postmodernity" (p. 1) (i.e., the period following the present one).

Thomson tells his readers at the outset that he has difficulty placing himself in the contemporary division of philosophy between analytic and continental thinkers. As someone who has also tried to defy or "bridge" this divide, I find works like this extremely heartening. Thomson's explanations of Heidegger's difficult later works are unfailingly clear, carefully laying out the arguments and explaining all technical terms. Furthermore, the book's organization guides the reader so smoothly through the steps of his discussion that it should make knee-jerk objections about Heideggerian obscurantism much harder to make.

Chapter 1 lays out the topic that Thomson owns, namely, ontotheology, which he calls "a skeleton key to Heidegger's notoriously difficult later thinking" (p. 2). According to Heidegger, each epoch in the history of philosophy has its own understanding of what it means to be (what Thomson calls "ontological epochality"), which informs all other views of that era ("ontological holism," pp. 7-8). This ontology entails a theology, broadly construed, in that the greatest entity will be the one that most fully embodies the era's sense of being, enabling this entity to explain reality as a whole. In ancient Greece, for example, what it meant to be was to be unchanging, hence the "beingest" beings were those that don't change at all -- the Forms; all other entities get their existence and essence from these. The present understanding of being, as captured by Nietzsche, is nihilistic technology where entities only count to the degree that we can use them for our purposes. Anything that does not fit our explanatory expectations or is extraneous to the satisfaction of our desires gets branded superstitious or merely subjective. Whereas Nietzsche recommends that we infuse the world with value once the death of God has removed its intrinsic meaning, Heidegger considers this strategy the worst form of nihilism. This focus on willing culminates in the empty "eternal recurrence" of seeking to optimize for the sake of optimization, sucking us into the whirlwind of efficiency where we become mere human resources (pp. 52, 75, 211).

In keeping with the doctrine of ontological holism, this attitude can be found everywhere in our culture, from science to aesthetics, as Thomson explains in chapter 2. Whereas his previous book, Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education, described the attitude’s presence in education, here he examines the way aesthetics reduces art to a producer of subjective experiences, mere delivery systems for stimulants and suppressants (pp. 45-51). The pastel colors painted on jail cell walls to calm prisoners would match this definition; pushpins fit as easily as poetry, depending on their hedonic efficaciousness.

The only escape from this self-perpetuating spiral of self-positing meaninglessness is to find a meaning that exceeds us. Reversing Kant, Heidegger believes that it is only that which does not entirely come from us and which cannot be fully controlled that can give meaning to our lives (pp. 22, 54, 60, 104, 215). Great works of art -- both their creation and their appreciation -- are paradigms of this kind of meaning; they make claims upon us rather than being posited by us. They have taken on some of the sheen of the sacred leftover in our God-fled world, which explains the horror we feel at acts of violence perpetrated on artworks. In particular, what Thomson calls "uncanny" works teach us to patiently attend to them as they unfold new layers of meaning (pp. 147, 218). Great works walk a razor's edge, calling for interpretation while escaping every particular interpretation. They fail if they are, on the one hand, too difficult to sustain any coherent reading, or if, on the other hand, they can be summarized or paraphrased without significant loss of meaning (pp. 68, 81, 217); in the terminology of "The Origin of the Work of Art," these failures represent the triumph of earth over world and world over earth, respectively. Great works create an irresolvable and thus ever-dynamic strife between the two.

Thomson's original and illuminating reading of "The Origin of the Work of Art" in chapter 3 develops these ideas. One significant contribution is his explanation of Meyer's poem, which has been ignored by the vast majority of commentators (including myself), as symbolizing the trickle-down ontology of the three main epochs of the history of being (pp. 66-71). Regarding the other two works covered by the essay, Thomson argues that whereas the temple founds a community's sense of what is worthy and important, van Gogh's painting makes the nature of art itself manifest (pp. 44-5, 87). The key point here is that while the painting definitely shows us something, it suggests much more; it is this suggestion, the almost-seen figures lurking in the background, that defines art.

Thomson has a highly original way of settling the much travelled debate over the identity of the shoes' owners by focusing on the phenomenological experience of viewing the painting (p. 112). The farmer Heidegger discusses is not the absent owner of the shoe, but rather a semi-present nebulous figure Thomson spies in a dark part of the shoes themselves.[1] What matters is that van Gogh's brushstrokes allow figures to emerge and take shape before our eyes without reaching full resolution, which would iron out all ambiguity. This is what art in general does, of course, by representing something in a medium that is not inherently representational and, furthermore, it is what we are doing all the time. What it means to be human is to create a self and a life from cultural inheritances that underdetermine what we make of them. As Heidegger argued in Being and Time, our lives never reach the full resolution where I can simply be a teacher or father; I am forever the unfinished project of becoming who I am. Technology tries to hide the limits of our control and the inescapability of our dependence, giving us the power-fantasy of complete autonomy. Farmers, on the other hand, live much closer to this truth (p. 116), as do artists (pp. 35, 76).

Thus, the central feature of postmodernity for Thomson is "ontological pluralism," which means that there are always more ways to interpret phenomena than we are aware of. This idea steers a course between two errors, avoiding both traditional ontotheological claims to have discovered the one true way reality works, and the postmodern rejection of any constraints on interpretation whatsoever (pp. 24, 100, 102, 126). I have always found this kind of "anything goes" hermeneutics to be a caricature of the great postmodern figures -- Derrida in particular -- but it can be found in many epigones. Both of these extremes prevent us from experiencing and participating in what can make life meaningful, namely, helping new meanings emerge from inchoate possibilities. Being always has more meanings to send, and we are unendingly open to new ways of understanding. This form of understanding is "built into the structure of all intelligibility" (p. 75, see also 92, 218), making us all, like Socrates, midwives.

The account of understanding indicates a tension within Heidegger's thought. Being and Time paradoxically made historicity an ahistorical feature of all Dasein; similarly, the later work vastly increases the differences among people at different points in history, but it still attributes this single structure of truth to all. On Thomson's reading, the form of postmodern art in some sense accurately represents, or at least enacts, the true nature of truth and being. In a counterpart to Heidegger's mythologizing of the Greeks that Caputo has criticized so well, postmodernity "gets it right." Thomson's reading thus adheres to what we might call an "epochal exceptionalism" concerning postmodernity. On this reading, Heidegger does not shy away from a metanarrative, although he does reject the ones singled out for disapproval by Lyotard. The postmodern era is unique in that it follows the close of metaphysics with Nietzsche, which allows it to escape the ontotheology that has plagued western civilization since at least Plato. Postmodernity accepts the ontological pluralism that all metaphysicians have recoiled from, thus putting us in a fundamentally new relationship with being rather than just ringing one more epochal variation (p. 9). We are stuck with the familiar paradox of relativism: we now know that there is no one right way to understand being, and this is the one right way to understand it.

This "epochal exceptionalism" connects with a concern I have always had with "The Origin of the Work of Art." Although it claims to apply to great works of art in general, it is hard to avoid the fact that it fits much better with the art of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century -- that is, the art contemporary with Heidegger -- than that of other eras. For example, Thomson discusses Michelangelo's careful study of a block of marble, thoroughly examining its veins and contours for weeks before "releasing" the David within by removing all extraneous stone (pp. 21-2, 24, 100-1, 103, 170). This is an excellent example of an artist responding rather than creating ex nihilo as the caricatured Romantic view has it. But once finished, David stands there with an air of inevitability. Not only does it not raise the question of what else Michelangelo might have carved out of the block, I would say that it closes off all other possibilities to the viewer. A finished work, like a finished Dasein, marks the impossibility of possibilities; this is what makes it finished, in contrast with Duchamp's description of The Large Glass as "definitively unfinished."[2]

Earlier works often deny or hide their earth; to switch to another example, Michelangelo's Pieta creates the incredible illusion of free-flowing cloth, the slump of Christ's body giving the almost tangible feel of yielding, fragile flesh, thoroughly disguising the hard marble. Rodin's sculptures, on the other hand, keep the roughness of the stone in the work, letting earth jut through world in Heidegger's terms like van Gogh's paintings (or Cézanne's or Klee's, two more of Heidegger's favorite painters). It is this that allows it to suggest more than it proclaims, embodying ontological pluralism in a way that few works before or after (think of abstract expressionism's emphasis on earth, or pop art's celebration of world) do.[3] Theories of art often give us criteria to judge works by, but Heidegger's seem strongly biased towards the work of his time.

Thomson applies his analysis to postmodern works of popular art: U2's Achtung Baby and Zooropa, and the comic book Watchmen. I must admit that I found these less interesting than other portions of the book, not because I snootily look down on such low-brow trash -- I happen to greatly admire Achtung Baby and Watchmen, and have long been interested in comics as contemporary mythology[4] -- but simply because I didn't get as much out of these discussions. Others may well find much of interest here.

More interesting is the idea, as briefly stated in the "Origin" essay but developed by Thomson, that other kinds of works can function like art, for instance, Heidegger's phenomenological descriptions function to help us experience things anew (217). After his discussion of strife, for example, I see familiar paintings in a new way; having read his lectures on Nietzsche I read Zarathustra differently. It takes little imagination to apply this to Thomson's discussion of Heidegger: after reading his book, I now see some of Heidegger's ideas and writings in a new light, though I will stop here and not apply this to my review of Thomson's reading of Heidegger's analysis of art.

But may we not stretch this idea even further? What most calls for ontological pluralism is being as such; while it temporarily solidifies in metaphysical interpretations for an epoch, it inevitably overthrows these "readings" or "manifestations" to take new forms (pp. 185, 209, 212, 216). In chapter 6, Thomson reads Heidegger's Contributions to Philosophy as modeled on the fugue because variations of a theme demonstrate the diversity of possible interpretations which must still recognizably be variations of the theme. What other artistic metaphors, metaphors being powerful ways of re-seeing familiar topics, may we employ? Perhaps we are the canvas upon which being paints, our worlds the masterpieces of existence. Or is being better thought of as the inexhaustible medium for our creations, turning the history of metaphysics into a kind of temporal museum of the ways the greatest among us have shaped it into coherent works? This gives us a helpful perspective on Heidegger's controversial readings of the canon, changing them from "violent" to "creative" (p. 197 n5). He is not arbitrarily imposing his own issues and views onto Kant or Nietzsche, but rather appropriating their insights in order to better express his own, the way Picasso pushed Cézanne a step to create cubism, or Warhol extended Duchamp. By inspiring and drawing out new ideas, Iain Thomson's Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity takes its rightful place along with Julian Young's excellent Heidegger's Philosophy of Art as an important piece of scholarship on this topic. In keeping with its own precepts, it does not definitively settle Heidegger's views on this topic once and for all but, like a work of art, opens up new questions and pathways for thought.

[1] Unfortunately, the photograph of this detail (p. 114) is rather murky. Thomson also makes the point, new to the vast secondary literature as far as I know, that the shoes couldn't have belonged to farmers because they wore wooden clogs to work rather than leather shoes (p. 117-8 n73).

[2] Thomson begins to explore a very interesting take on this on p. 178 n19.

[3] Ironically, Michelangelo's very late slave sculptures are powerful examples of this strife.

[4] Kierkegaard gets a brief mention as someone who wrote under assumed identities (p. 158 n49). I think this superhero connection can be pushed further: here is a man psychologically scarred by guilt due to a tragedy befalling his father, who goes on to sacrifice the reputation of his "real identity" as a layabout womanizer while working incredibly hard behind the mask of pseudonyms to fight evil. In short, Kierkegaard is Batman. I would call him an existential Batman, but that strikes me as a pleonasm.

The Hulk, on the other hand, is a Christ figure, an infinitely powerful being locked in the frail body of a mortal who prefers to suffer rather than to unleash his vast power, even on those who deserve smiting. Bruce Banner's "Don't make me angry" is simply the comic book version of Jesus' "Forgive them Father, for they know not what they do," with both stories inevitably ending in an apocalyptic judgment day where the all-powerful being emerges from his mortal frame to punish the wicked.