Heidegger in France

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Dominique Janicaud, Heidegger in France, François Raffoul and David Pettigrew (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2015, 540pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253017734.

Reviewed by Dennis J. Schmidt, Western Sydney University


This book is an unusual intellectual history of a period and tradition still in flux, still unfolding and unfinished. It is sweeping in scope (covering over seventy years of Heidegger's widespread influence in French intellectual life) and equally wide ranging in its style: one finds theoretical discussions and academic debates discussed with insight and precision, and yet this book is full of anecdotes, as well as personal recollections (in the form of seven "Epilogues" appearing at various points). It tells the story of how Heidegger's thought entered, and often defined, some of the liveliest debates of French intellectual life in the 20th century. Dominique Janicaud (1937-2002) was well placed to tell this story. A relative of Jean Beaufret (who was the recipient of Heidegger's "Letter on Humanism" and a key figure in the French reception of Heidegger), Janicaud was himself a significant voice in these debates: his previous major work, La Puissance du rationnel (1985)[1], pressed Heidegger's thought on technology and science in new directions. A generous and careful person, Janicaud's efforts to tell the story of Heidegger's legacy in France bear the hallmarks of his person: they are balanced, nuanced, thoughtful, and directed at understanding more than passing judgment.

The English translation is presented here in a single volume, whereas the French original (2001) was published as two volumes. The first volume, which is here published as Part One, traces the influence of Heidegger upon twentieth-century French thought. The twelve chapters begin with accounts of the first references to Heidegger in France (in 1928 by Georges Gurvitch) as well as the first translation of a text by Heidegger (in 1931, "Qu'est-ce que la métaphysique?" in a journal that also contained an essay by the young Sartre), and they culminate in contemporary debates that owe their shape to this legacy of Heidegger, debates that range from theology to ethics, political life, and technology. The second part of the English translation contains seven (the French edition has eighteen) interviews from those Janicaud calls as "witnesses" to the real impact of Heidegger in France. These interviews, although brief, are often illuminating. The remarks by Derrida, Marion, Nancy, and Lacoue-Labarthe are especially interesting (see, for instance, Derrida saying that Heidegger "haunts me like a sort of strict father"). Taken together with the translators' introduction and the often quite substantive footnotes, Heidegger in France is a remarkable achievement and an intellectual history of the first-order. It stands as a powerful reminder that philosophy does not happen in vacuums, but in cultures, journals, classrooms, and that it is forged in debates as well as face-to face discussions that can be creative even when they are full of misunderstanding or hidden agendas. It is also a reminder of the too often neglected role of translation in the transmission of ideas -- Heidegger here has a recognizably French accent.

In telling this story of Heidegger's influence in France, Janicaud calls attention to a key thread running through the center of French intellectual life. As he points out, Heidegger's presence in France did not unfold "continuously and in the same way over the course of seventy years: before the war, after Liberation, up to the 'Farias affair,' and beyond" (p. 6). Nonetheless, one finds this certainty: "omnipresence in France of an influence, direct or indirect, of Heidegger's thought and work . . . there is hardly any sector of knowledge or intellectual activity that has not been positively or negatively affected by that thought" (p. 301). This is a remarkable claim, but Janicaud's analysis is so compelling that such an assertion (almost) does not seem excessive. What does become apparent is that Heidegger's influence, which moved from existentialism to deconstruction, touched upon theological debates, and clearly became a political question, had different roots in France than the influence he exercised in Germany or in the Anglophone world.

In Germany, Heidegger's presence was originally rooted in his genius as a teacher, as one who could inspire Arendt, Gadamer, Löwith, and others. His students became his great first champions and the testimony of these students is quite striking: he was apparently quite a formidable presence and personality in the classroom.[2] Likewise, Heidegger's place in German intellectual life was derailed by his involvement with the Nazi regime much earlier in Germany than elsewhere. After he stepped down as Rektor of the University of Freiburg, Heidegger had his problems with the Nazis, who never quite trusted him. After the war, he was never fully rehabilitated in Germany, never again permitted to teach at the university, and the focus of sharp attacks by Adorno and others.[3] But Heidegger's place in France was different and the bases of his influence were not so founded in his person, nor did they -- at least until the late 1980s -- carry quite the same political taint as in Germany. Indeed, Janicaud makes clear that Heidegger saw in France and in his French friends (most notably Beaufret) a path to some sort of salvation and a new audience. While Janicaud's book does not lay out this contrast of the ways lines of influence operate differently in different linguistic, political, institutional, and national arenas, it does lead one to appreciate just how important such arenas are for the dissemination of ideas. Traditions are formed in many ways, and this book admirably details one such tradition and the multiple lines of its complex formation.

Janicaud calls attention to two rather odd delays that punctuate this story of Heidegger in France. First, that Heidegger did not go to France until 1955, when he was 65 years old. Given that one can easily ride a bicycle from Freiburg to France, this is quite astonishing. That first trip, which included some time in Paris at the flat of Beaufret and a stay at Lacan's home in Guitrancourt,[4] culminated in Heidegger's attendance at a conference at Cerisy where he delivered the lecture "What is Philosophy?". Janicaud's account of this trip and conference is among the most interesting stories told. One reads, for instance, of Heidegger's meetings with René Char, when they discussed their mutual admiration for Melville; one also finds Heidegger walking with Georges Braque, and on a harrowing drive with Lacan. There are accounts of Heidegger's exchanges with Ricœur and Marcel, and one learns as well of Heidegger's refusal (or perhaps inability) to speak French. The second odd late arrival in this story is a French translation of Sein und Zeit. Janicaud begins Chapter 9 by noting that until 1985, only the first forty-four paragraphs (i.e. only Division One) were published in French (and that was in 1964). Then, in 1985 and 1986, two rival translations were published (one by the prestigious publishing house Gallimard, the other a "pirate" publication).

What makes these strange delayed appearances so surprising is the realization that Heidegger's enormous impact and fame in France was not founded either upon any personal presence, which had been so decisive for his influence in Germany, nor upon any widespread study of his major and most celebrated work. Long before Heidegger would set foot in France or Sein und Zeit (and other of his texts) were translated into French, Heidegger had been a serious fascination for French intellectuals. What this makes clear is how much the reception of Heidegger in France was funneled through a relatively small number of texts and an equally small number of those who were able to engage Heidegger in German. Furthermore, as Janicaud notes, "it is clear that the 'reception' [of Heidegger] would have been infinitely less influential if it had not been sustained and stimulated by the brightest minds, from Koyré to Levinas, from Beaufret to Birault, and from Merleau-Ponty to Derrida" (p. 302). The reception of Heidegger in France was never "docile" or a matter of "repetitive imitations," but was invariably "inventive," "complex," often "brilliant," and frequently "noisy." Precisely for these reasons, and precisely because "Heidegger" as a set of ideas and a challenge to orthodoxies was not simply a presence in academic circles, the role of Heidegger in France is widespread and it is clear that his footprints will continue to be found there for many years to come. From the first mentions of the name "Heidegger" in the 1920s (by Gurvitch and Brunschvicg) and the first real encounters with Heidegger the man in Davos, Switzerland where Levinas and Gandillac would participate in the philosophical gatherings there, to the "Sartre bomb" of Being and Nothingness in 1943, and up to the present figures of Derrida, Foucault, Deleuze, and Nancy, this book makes clear that Heidegger has been a "omnipresent" and "diversified" force in French intellectual life.

Janicaud has told an important story and drawn a thick line through the history of French thought from the 1920s to the dawn of the 21st century. It is a story masterfully managed and one that could be told by very few given its almost epic character and the complexity of its main players. It is a story that will continue and evolve, and so will need to be told again, but the book is the sort of history that will not become outdated. Quite the contrary, one suspects that this window into French intellectual life will stand for a long time as one of the important testimonies of how one tradition developed in France in the 20th century. During the past two decades many of the key players in this story died. Among the great achievements of Janicaud's book is the life that he has managed to convey of these events and the vivid sense of creative minds struggling to understand their own times.

Janicaud has shined a bright light on the impact of Heidegger in France, but it should be remembered that this impact is, in the end, just one among many of the forces that drive ideas and that have shaped French thought today. At times, Janicaud's enthusiasm for his topic and his passion for following through on his conviction that it is a "certainty" that Heidegger has been an "omnipresent . . . influence [in France]" can carry him too far. At times, one wishes for a bit more moderation: Janicaud sees with such clarity the claim of Heidegger that he tends to overlook other claims, other forces at work in the debates he discusses. This tendency to a sort of tunnel vision is manifested in two habits that I must confess are a bit off-putting: the rather excessive use of exclamation points and the habit of referring to Heidegger as "the Master"! But, in the end, I believe those criticisms need to be put down as quibbles more than problems. This is a serious book, and one that taught me a great deal that I did not know and that illuminated much that I did not fully understand. It is well translated and, given the sweep and complexity of its topic, rather "easy" and quite enjoyable to read. Those interested in contemporary French thought and those who work in Heidegger will benefit from reading it. Janicaud sheds light on the contemporary French philosophical scene and he has done this from an angle seldom seen by others. It is a lively story and reminds us that the life of ideas, the destiny of a thought, is an exciting matter.

[1] Translated into English by Peg Birmingham and Elizabeth Birmingham as Powers of the Rational: Science, Technology, and the Future of Thought, Indiana University Press, 1995.

[2] Here one could point to Arendt's essay on the occasion of Heidegger's 80th birthday, "Martin Heidegger at Eighty, New York Review of Books, October 21, 1971, Gadamer's Heidegger's Ways (SUNY Press, 1994), and Löwith's Mein Leben in Deutschland vor und nach 1933 (Metzler, 2007).

[3] Adorno, Jargon der Eigenlichkeit (Suhrkamp, 1964) and Habermas "Mit Heidegger gegen Heidegger denken" (1953).

[4] The cover of the English translation has a photo from this visit that shows Heidegger with Kostas Axelos, Jacques Lacan, Jean Beaufret, Elfriede Heidegger, and Sylvia Bataille.