Heidegger in Ruins: Between Philosophy and Ideology

Heidegger In Ruins

Richard Wolin, Heidegger in Ruins: Between Philosophy and Ideology, Yale University Press, 2023, 488pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300233186. 

Reviewed by Emmanuel Faye, University of Rouen Normandie


Heidegger in Ruins is the culmination of a series of books, written over the course of three decades, that Richard Wolin has devoted to Martin Heidegger and his most prominent Jewish students. In the wake of the posthumous publication of the eight volumes of the Black Notebooks in Heidegger’s Complete Works, Wolin, like other interpreters before him, makes an important attempt to take stock of Heidegger’s work.

The book begins with “A Note on Sources,” where Wolin stresses the significance he ascribes to Heidegger’s correspondence. It should be noted, however, that he relies solely on the published correspondence and has not examined the now available handwritten sources. A substantial introduction entitled “Heidegger in Black” not only discusses the Black Notebooks, but also the 1934 seminar on Hegel and the State and the Winter Course of 1933–1934, where Heidegger calls for the “total extermination” of the enemy grafted onto the innermost root of the people (5). Wolin cites a key passage in the Black Notebooks where Heidegger proclaims the “end of philosophy” and its giving way to the “metapolitics of the historical people” (7). He also notes the assessment of the German Heidegger scholar Günther Figal that the anti-Semitism of the Black Notebooks “is incompatible with the vocation of philosophy.” Figal, true to his principles, resigned in January 2015 as president of the Heidegger Gesellschaft.

Wolin, however, comes to a different conclusion. He rails against “some commentators” who, he claims, have argued “that one should abandon Heidegger’s philosophy as irreparably contaminated and, hence, irredeemable” (12). Wolin does not specify who these commentators are. He mentions in the preceding pages Giorgio Agamben, Peter Trawny, Jean-Luc Nancy and Donatella di Cesare, all of whom have reaffirmed their belief in Heidegger’s major philosophical importance, despite his anti-Semitic and völkisch statements. Does Wolin avoid naming those who came to a different conclusion out of a fear of debate? But not identifying those against whom the arguments are directed hinders the possibility of a precise, well-argued philosophical discussion. The terms in which Wolin raises the problem are also debatable. The issue is not whether to “abandon” Heidegger’s “philosophy”, but whether a worldview and a body of work as fundamentally racist and anti-Semitic as Heidegger’s still deserves to be considered a great philosophy in the strict sense of the term.

Wolin’s response to these anonymous critical “commentators” is to “patiently and systematically” reassess Heidegger’s thought in light of the newly published texts. The publication of this book is supposed to contribute to a “long-term process of rethinking and reconsideration” of his thought. This program, which has not even begun and is thus difficult to assess, accords with the lines from Nietzsche’s Human, All Too Human that Wolin uses as the epigraph to his work and from which he draws the metaphor of ruin. His point is that the value of a philosophy lies not “in the whole, in the building,” but “in the bricks,” which “possess value as material” even if the edifice is destroyed.

Wolin’s project can be summarized as follows: After the recent publication of Heidegger’s seminars, lectures, correspondence, and the Black Notebooks has revealed the Heideggerian edifice to be in ruins, Wolin wants to show that Heidegger's writings can nonetheless provide philosophy with valuable material that can be re-used.[1] Should we conclude that Wolin—like Trawny, Nancy, and di Cesare before him—seeks to salvage the seemingly valuable philosophical remains of Heideggerian thought following the publication of the Black Notebooks? And that this rescue operation is carried out in the face of opposition from mysterious and anonymous critical “commentators”? Or are these statements rhetorical, designed to safeguard the project against potential attacks by the most uncompromising of Heideggerians? It is in any case striking that Wolin places his project under the aegis of Nietzsche, given his previous unsparing criticism of this figure. He might argue that this is merely ironic. Yet the methodological fact remains that the Nietzsche citation fits with Wolin’s aim of re-evaluating the Heideggerian material.

Heidegger in Ruins has no conclusion, but the final pages of the introduction (20–25) allow us to understand the intentions of the work and can be seen as a kind of summing up of the entire undertaking. I will therefore review the six chapters of the book before discussing these pages.

The first chapter is devoted to the post-1945 manipulation of Heidegger’s texts, first by Heidegger himself and then by the editors of the Complete Works. This issue has been well-documented and Wolin restricts himself to providing second-hand examples. He particularly relies on Sidonie Kellerer’s critical study of the 1938 conference on “The Age of the World Picture” (2014). Using the original manuscripts conserved in Marbach, Kellerer showed how Heidegger tacitly altered this text when he published it in 1950 in the Holzwege. Wolin even uses the very title of Kellerer’s study, “Rewording the Past,” to head one of the chapter’s sections (37). But he doesn’t sufficiently acknowledge that these Heideggerian procedures were not limited to such rewritings. Heidegger’s mode of expression itself, especially his “indirect writing,” merits proper philological study so as to understand how Heidegger manipulates philosophical terms to hint at far more than he explicitly says. This is not just a question of editorial probity, but concerns, on a deeper level, the very use of language.

There is a notable terminological issue throughout the book: Although Wolin mentions statements Heidegger made that are radically anti-Semitic or that praise the Nazi party, he does not examine the links between these statements and his National Socialism, preferring instead to speak of him as a conservative revolutionary (50, 53). He does not explain the reasons for this politico-historical downplaying of Heidegger’s actual political stance.

The second chapter shares the book’s title. Wolin begins by discussing several “metapolitical” statements from the early Black Notebooks as well as from the winter 1933–34 seminar On the Essence and Concepts of Nature, History and State. Theodore Kisiel (2002) and I (2009) were the first to publish extensive hitherto unpublished extracts from the latter almost two decades ago. This seminar is a good example of the problems posed by the so-called Complete Works, which do not in fact deserve this name since this text was omitted in the Gesamtausgabe.

Wolin goes on to emphasize the destructive dimension of Heideggerian thought, quoting a famous phrase about the “destruction of the founding principles of Western metaphysics: spirit, logos, reason.” However, he claims this statement stems from Heidegger’s Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics (62), whereas Heidegger actually made it during his famous Davos Lectures. Wolin again links Heidegger to the “revolutionary-conservative worldview” (61, 66, 68, etc.,) as well as to the perspective of Kulturkritiker such as Oswald Spengler or Alfred Weber (68).

Wolin also draws on Heidegger’s correspondence with his brother Fritz, excerpts of which Arnulf Heidegger published in 2015. These texts confirm the radical nature of Heidegger’s Hitlerism. His identification with Hitler is such that Fritz wrote to him on April 3rd, 1933 saying: “Hitler’s bearing and countenance, as conveyed by contemporary photographs, remind me of you” (70). Heidegger’s Hitlerism is no less radical in his Black Notebooks: in 1934, he rejoices that “the Führer has awakened a new reality: a reality that has galvanized my Denken and redirected it along the right path” (2014, 111, quoted 75). However, although Wolin provides a good documentation of Heidegger’s Hitlerism, he does not draw any serious conclusions from it. He continues to situate Heidegger among the “conservative revolutionary thinkers,” in this instance in the company of Carl Schmitt and Ernst Jünger (77).

The rest of the chapter compiles judgments from highly dissimilar authors: Christian Tilitsky, Theodor Adorno, Emmanuel Levinas, Claude Lefort, Jürgen Habermas, Thomas Assheuer, Hans-Georg Gadamer, and Ernst Tugendhat. The fact that the thesis of revisionist historian Christian Tilitsky is quoted without any reservations and as an authority is the most surprising thing here. A disciple of the Heideggerian historian Ernst Nolte, who believed that Heidegger made the right choice in joining the Nazi party in 1933, Tilitsky supported the thesis of a seamless continuity in German philosophy before and after 1933 despite the dismissal and forced exile of “non-Aryan” professors and reduced Nazi anti-Semitism to the defense of particularity against universalism. And to equate authors as different as Gadamer, who in 1942 extolled “völkisch life,” and Adorno is no less confusing.

No less surprising is Wolin’s reference to Hannah Arendt as a relevant critical authority on Heidegger. From the late 1940s onwards she set herself entirely to the task of rehabilitating his reputation. In a palinode that cannot fail to surprise the attentive reader, Wolin argues the opposite of what he had shown two decades earlier in his Heidegger’s Children (2001). There he claimed that Hannah Arendt’s “political existentialism” was “profoundly elitist and undemocratic.” In Heidegger in Ruins, on the contrary, he presents Arendt as defending, against Heidegger, “the virtues of the ‘democratic invention’” (81). There is no explanation for this reversal. At the end of the chapter, Wolin cites Arendt’s claim that Heidegger leads us “out of philosophy” in her 1946 article “What is Existenz-Philosophy?” (96), but he fails to mention that Arendt later entirely disavowed her article and categorically refused to have it republished in her lifetime.

This second chapter seems confused in its conclusions. Wolin emphasizes Heidegger’s radical Hitlerism and provides supporting citations while continuing to classify him, without further explanation, as a conservative revolutionary, even though conservative revolutionaries were generally distinguished by their distrust of, or hostility towards, Hitler. This hostility often resulted in their ostracism or even, like Edgar Julius Jung and Gregor Strasser, their being murdered during the Night of the Long Knives, or, like the National-Bolshevik Ernst Niekisch, interned in Brandenburg-Görden prison. Moreover, Wolin asserts that Heidegger’s taste for secrecy “caused him to abandon philosophy’s commitment to rigor, coherence and argument” (91), but the last words of the chapter seek to save Heidegger philosophically by arguing, following Ernst Tugendhat, that he nevertheless remains a philosopher because he “retained the concept of ‘truth’” (99). It is clear, however, from his 1933–1934 lectures On the Essence of Truth, that although Heidegger retains the word “truth,” just as he continues to use the terms “work” or “freedom,” he retains nothing of it as a philosophical concept.

In chapter 3, Wolin revisits the thesis that Heidegger’s critique of “biologism” in no way implies a rejection of National Socialist racism. He makes use of Bernard Grün’s discovery that, in June 1933, Rector Heidegger campaigned for the retention in Freiburg of the French raciologist Arthur de Gobineau’s papers, as compiled by the German race theorist Ludwig Schemann (106). And he draws on the journalist Thomas Vašek’s article on Heidegger’s appropriation of a phrase from the 1935 German translation of an essay by the Italian fascist and pro-Nazi theorist Julius Evola, a great admirer of the SS, in which Evola asserts that “When a race has lost touch with that which alone has and can give permanence—with the world of being (Sein) —then the collective organisms formed by it, whatever be their greatness and power, descend fatefully into the world of chance.” However, in his article, Vašek goes further than Wolin by showing that Evola’s racism, as appropriated by Heidegger, “represented a kind of spiritual racism, which, however, does not exclude a biological concept of race, as propagated by the Nazi racialists, but rather goes beyond it” (2015). In fact, Heidegger does not reject all biological concepts of race, but mainly those based on a form of biologism of Anglo-Saxon and Darwinist origins that he calls “liberal.”

Wolin is closer to the mark when he shows that Heidegger aims to make race “existential” by associating it with Stimmung (148–149). Nevertheless, it seems difficult to speak, as Wolin does, of a racial turn or Kehre here (149). For as early as 1916 in his correspondence with Elfride, Heidegger spoke of the “German race” in opposition to the “Jewification” of universities and culture. We can note that, for obvious reasons of caution, references to race, like anti-Semitic allusions, remain indirect and euphemistic in Heidegger’s writings published before 1933.

Chapters 4 and 5 take up themes that have already been dealt with extensively in critical studies of Nazism in general and Heidegger in particular: the National Socialist and Heideggerian concepts of work, land, and soil. Wolin shows he has thoroughly assimilated research published on these topics over the last decades. He usefully summarizes, for example, Joan Campbell’s studies of Joy in Work in Nazism and Franck Edler and Charles Bambach’s on Heidegger and Alfred Baeumler. However, these two chapters cannot be said to contain new interpretative breakthroughs.

The sixth and final chapter, devoted to the relationship between Heideggerian thought and the New Right, is one of the most interesting in the entire book. Wolin offers a useful survey of Heidegger’s influence on the New Right in France, the USA and Germany, and on the Russian ideologist Alexandr Dugin. He shows the “lexical inversion” (345–346) of statements systematized by members of the New Right, with Dugin, for example, calling for a Nuremberg Trial for liberalism (351). It is surprising that Wolin does not mention Victor Farías’s pioneering work on the subject (2008). Tracing in even greater detail the evolution in the reception of Heidegger by the New Right would have been an important task here. For example, the young Alain de Benoist was initially unreceptive to Heidegger, leaving him to commentators seeking a renewal of theology such as Jean-Luc Marion, with whom Alain de Benoist had produced and published a book of interviews. At the time, de Benoist had claimed Friedrich Nietzsche and Louis Rougier as his own. Only as Heidegger’s Nazism became more widely known in the 1980s thanks to the critical work of authors such as Farías, did de Benoist and others in the New Right begin to draw upon Heidegger as it became evident that his völkisch radicalism fit with their own views.

The big question remains that of the “Conservative Revolution.” Quoting Pierre-André Taguieff, Wolin rightly points out that “the turn to the ‘conservative revolution’ enabled the Nouvelle Droite to eliminate positive and direct references to National Socialism” (316). But here it is essential to energetically refuse to become the unwitting dupe of this strategy by classifying National Socialist and Hitlerian authors such as Martin Heidegger and Carl Schmitt with Kulturkritiker such as Oswald Spengler, who were never Hitlerians and thus only compromised themselves to a lesser degree. So it’s not enough to assert that Armin Mohler “rehabilitated conservative revolutionary thought for an entire generation of far-right intellectuals” (315). What needs to be shown is that by seizing on an oxymoron that expresses a political aporia, Mohler actually created the myth of a political movement he called the “Conservative Revolution” so as to distinguish it from National Socialism for apologetic purposes. Mohler was very aware of what he was doing. In an unpublished letter from June 1949 to his friend Hans Fleig, he recounts how his thesis supervisor, Karl Jaspers, said: “Your work is a large-scale denazification of these authors [whom Mohler classifies as ‘conservative revolutionaries’] that is captivating and will be read with avidity in Germany today.”[2]

This brings us back to the problems posed by the theses set out at the end of the book’s introduction. For the lengthy Postscript does not offer a philosophical conclusion, only a useful historical account of the persistence of Heidegger’s radical political positions after 1945. Heidegger’s relationship to the “Conservative Revolution” was a legitimate issue when the recently published works of Mohler on the “Conservative Revolution” (1950) and Christian Graf von Krockow on the supposed “decisionism” of Carl Schmitt and Martin Heidegger (1958) were subjected to critical scrutiny. This question was explored, for example, by Jean-Pierre Faye in a landmark article (1961), and by Pierre Bourdieu (1975). Since then, the new texts published (lectures, courses, seminars, correspondence, the Black Notebooks) and the accompanying critical works have rendered this approach to Heideggerian thought largely obsolete.

In five pages, Wolin dispatches the difficult and major problem that critical researchers have been trying to elucidate for the past two decades, namely, how can we designate an author as a “philosopher” whose thinking is now widely recognized as being radically anti-Semitic, racist, völkisch, and genocidal? An author who, moreover, repeatedly proclaimed the end of philosophy? On several occasions, Wolin acknowledges Heidegger’s destructive intent. He cites, for example, the following statement in the Black Notebooks: “We must abolish [philosophy] in order to prepare the way for the entirely ‘Other’: Metapolitics” (103). Or: “Today, we must finally put an end to philosophizing, since Volk and race are no longer adequate to it” (150). Yet Wolin draws no conclusions from these statements. He continues to speak of a “crucial paradigm shift” and “legitimate and propitious philosophical topoi” (22). Wolin thinks he can rely on the judgment of Emmanuel Levinas, who “viewed Heidegger’s Existenzphilosophie as akin to a revelation.” But he doesn’t produce any philosophical analysis of his own to back up this judgment, nor does he take into account the fact that the Black Notebooks—which Levinas could not have known of—revealed that for Heidegger the philosophy of existence was nothing but a delusion in which he didn’t recognize himself. Wolin makes little use of the most critical and in-depth research and discussion of these issues in the USA and Germany in the wake of the publication of the Black Notebooks (for instance, Fried, 2019; Heinz, 2019).

Wolin claims to be following in the steps of Günther Anders. But Anders was more incisive and critical of Heidegger in 1946 than Wolin is today, for example in the text he wrote on “Heidegger und Hitler,” published posthumously in Über Heidegger. Rather than delving into the extent of Heideggerian National Socialism and Hitlerism, Wolin instead returns to a problem from the 1950s–1970s, writing that “Heidegger’s existential ontology is shot through with the idiolect of the conservative revolution” (24). Johannes Fritsche, in fact, has shown that as early as Sein und Zeit, Heidegger’s thought seems to be radically national-socialist, and in the German version of his book, he published a lengthy rebuttal of Wolin’s interpretations of Sein und Zeit, believing that they “are indistinguishable from [the] postmodern interpretations” that he considers erroneous (2014, 270).

If Heidegger in Ruins is taken as an essay in the history of political ideas, the book deserves to be seen as a relatively well-informed popular work, particularly with respect to the New Right, and as largely useful—with the exception of its omission of the most recent critical works—to readers who have not kept up with the advances in research over the last two decades. However, Wolin does not just present Heidegger in Ruins as a contribution to the history of political ideas, but also as a book of philosophical reflection. And on this point, it’s hard not to be deeply dissatisfied by the polemical and vague statements at the end of the lengthy introduction. Without proposing his own philosophical analysis, Wolin is content to reiterate the long-standing positions of Jürgen Habermas and Ernst Tugendhat, as if the publication of the Black Notebooks and the deepening of critical research in recent decades had shed no new light on the core of the problem.

With no index or bibliography, no investigation of primary sources such as the available archives and no serious consideration of the latest state of critical research, Heidegger in Ruins ultimately seems less a contribution to scholarship than an attempt to popularize the issues addressed.

A few words remain to be said of the metaphor of ruin. After recalling that it was a Benjaminian metaphor, Martin Jay asked Wolin what kind of edifice could be built from this debris. Wolin’s answer was neither clear nor unambiguous. In using this metaphor, then, Wolin is being consistent when he claims to have “sought to honor hermeneutical directives that Heidegger himself provided” (24): while the author rightly combats Heidegger’s thinking in terms of political ideas, he follows in his footsteps to some extent by considering his writings to be “philosophical.” Since he simultaneously proclaims the inseparability of Heidegger’s political and “philosophical” dimensions, Wolin bequeaths his own dilemma to the reader without providing any illumination.


I would like to thank Aengus Daly for his revision of the English version of my review.


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Benoist, A. de, et Marion, J.-L. (1970) Avec ou sans Dieu ? Affrontement entre Jean-Luc Marion – Alain de Benoist. Paris: Beauchesne.

Bourdieu, P. (1975) L’ontologie politique de Martin Heidegger. Actes de la recherche en sciences sociales, 109–156 (reissued and enlarged, Les Éditions de Minuit, 1978).

Farias, V. (2008) L’eredità di Heidegger nel neonazismo, nel neofascismo e nel fondamentalismo islamico. Milano: Medusa.

Faye, E. (2009) Heidegger. The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy in Light of the Unpublished Seminars of 1933–1935. Transl. by Michael Smith. Foreword by Tom Rockmore. New Haven & London: Yale University Press.

Faye, J.-P. (1961) Heidegger et la ‘Révolution’, Médiations, Revue des expressions contemporaines, Les Éditions de Minuit, 151–159.

Fried, G. (2019) Confronting Heidegger: A Critical Dialogue on Politics and Philosophy; London-New York: Rowman & Littlefield International.

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Heinz, M., Bender, T. (2019) “Sein und Zeit neu verhandelt. Untersuchungen zu Heideggers Hauptwerk, Hamburg: Felix Meiner.

Jay, M., Wolin, R. (2023) Heidegger in Ruins, a Dialogue Between Richard Wolin and Martin Jay: https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=R5-cjhdaexc

Kellerer, S. (2014) Rewording the Past: The Postwar Publication of a 1938 Lecture by Martin Heidegger, Modern Intellectual History , Vol. 11 , Issue 3 , 575–602.

Kisiel, T. (2002) Heidegger als Politischer Erzieher: der NSArbeiterstaat als Erziehungsstaat, 1933–1934, Die Zeit Heidegger. Ed. Norbert Lesniewski. Frankfurt am Main: Lang, 71–87.

Krockow, C. Graf von 51958) Die Entscheidung, Eine Untersuchung über Ernst Jünger, Carl Schmitt, Martin Heidegger, Stuttgart: Ferdinand Enke.

Mohler, A. (1950) Die konservative Revolution in Deutschland 1918–1932, Grundriß ihrer Weltanschauungen. Stuttgart: Friedrich Vorwerk, 1950.

Vašek, T. (2015) Ein spirituelles Umsturzprogramm. FAZ, 30 December.

Wolin, R. (1982) Walter Benjamin: An Aesthetic of Redemption. New York: Columbia University Press.

Wolin, R. (2001) Heidegger’s Children: Hannah Arendt, Karl Löwith, Hans Jonas, and Herbert Marcuse. Princeton:Princeton University Press.

[1] As Martin Jay pointed out in an interview following the publication of Wolin’s book, the metaphor of ruin could also be seen as borrowed from Walter Benjamin, to whom Wolin dedicated his first book (1982). The significance that Benjamin ascribes to this metaphor at the end of his Theses on History is well-known. And the aesthetics of ruin recurs throughout Wolin's work on Benjamin .

[2] Thanks to Sidonie Kellerer for drawing my attention to this previously unpublished statement.