Heidegger, Metaphysics and the Univocity of Being

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Philip Tonner, Heidegger, Metaphysics and the Univocity of Being, Continuum, 2010, 218pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441172297.

Reviewed by Jeremiah Hackett, University of South Carolina


This book is a study of Heidegger's works, early and late, in the light of the idea of the univocity of being. The central thesis is that, allowing for differences of context, project, history, and the Kehre or turn in Heidegger's ways from Phenomenology to Thought, one can argue for the consistent presence of the notion of univocity of being in all of his works. "I aim to show that there is an underlying univocal sense of being in Heidegger's philosophy" (p. 65). This is the explicit thesis of the book, which is repeated in every chapter. It claims to be a radically new thesis. The evidence for this thesis is gathered from many of Heidegger's works, beginning with the Habilitation text and ending with the later works. There is an Introduction, a conclusion and an appendix.

The first chapter provides an interpretation of the notion of univocity of being in the context of Aristotle's Categories and the Metaphysics. This serves as background to the remaining chapters, which deal with Heidegger and Duns Scotus (Thomas of Erfurt is not examined, and no mention is made of recent research such as S. J. McGrath, The Early Heidegger and Medieval Philosophy, 2006), univocity and phenomenology, univocity in Being and Time and related works from the 1920s, univocity in the later Heidegger (c. 1930-69), and univocity and the problem of history.

As noted in the introduction, the primary explicit thesis of the book is based on the view of Rudolf Allers that "Being is a univocal term" for Heidegger. The author holds that "This remark when taken with Deleuze's pronouncement that Heidegger 'follows Scotus,' motivates my project" (p. 4). The Appendix is concerned with "The Univocity of Being: Deleuze" (p. 185-88). It is the key to the thesis of the book. Deleuze is made normative for a reading of Scotus, all of the history of philosophy, and all of Heidegger's works. Further, the author seems to agree with Deleuze that "The central concern of the new onto-philosophy is the univocity of being" (p. 185). He argues that Heidegger and Deleuze both reject the medieval doctrine of analogy of being as representative of medieval ontotheology and assert the need to move beyond analogy (at least in a strong medieval ontotheological sense) and affirm univocity as a necessary condition for doing contemporary philosophy.

The line of influence then for Deleuze leads from Duns Scotus through Spinoza to Nietzsche. Heidegger is seen to have fallen short of a complete reduction to univocity. With Deleuze, there is no question of "overcoming metaphysics" in Heidegger's sense. Rather, one has a pure metaphysics of immanence that rejects concern with "God, the world and the self." "Deleuze set out to find the metaphysics that is required by modern science, and it was his view that only an ontology of univocity could provide philosophy with a truly philosophical concept of being" (p. 188). The imputation of the Deleuzean doctrine of immanence to Heidegger in parts of the text is questionable. It was precisely the residue of Cartesian immanence theory in Husserl that Heidegger in Being and Time sought to overcome. More questionable, however, is the imposition of a univocal doctrine of modern science on a thinker who claimed that "science does not think" and who offered a radical critique of naïve scientism as techno-science.

How does the author relate univocity of being to the mature Heidegger. In the introduction, he states that "Dasein's temporality is revealed as the transcendental horizon for the understanding of being. As such, all being is understood in terms of time. To that extent, being is univocally understood in terms of time and being itself is temporal" (p. 8). Thus, the temporality of Dasein is seen by the author as the central reference point of early Heidegger's univocal concept of being. The author interprets Heidegger's various references to medieval analogy of being as something negative. The concept of analogy of being is something associated only with medieval and Cartesian ontotheology. The one exception to this is the use of analogy by Heidegger in the late 1920s, although in general, the author starts with a qualified acceptance of Thomas Sheehan's account of analogy of being in early Heidegger.

Chapter one begins with Aristotle on substance and ends with Scotus on univocity of being. Paronomy is seen as playing the central role in both metaphysics and theology. The author sees Heidegger as rejecting Aristotle's view that there is only one set of categories for being. He sees Heidegger as holding that being is said in many ways. "Rather, it is said across a plurality of regions of being each with their own set of categories" (p. 17). Further, "By contrast to Aristotle (on substance), Heidegger conceives Dasein as the ultimate ontological center to which all other regions of being are related" (p. 18). Here one might ask: does not Heidegger begin with what is unsaid in Aristotle, namely, how to account for the unity of the many senses of Being? Is that not the question that inspired Heidegger throughout his ways of doing Philosophy?

The second part of this chapter deals with medieval philosophy. The general characterization of medieval philosophy may not sit well with its modern interpreters: "For the medieval philosopher faith was the space of philosophy. Faith grounded the intelligibility of the world" (p. 19). That is, there was no proper philosophy in the middle ages. Scotus is held to be less of a medieval thinker than Aquinas.

Chapter two, "Heidegger, Scotus and Univocity," is divided into two sections. The first is titled "The Question of Being" and consists of a very general review of diverse themes: the influence of Brentano's On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle, early Heidegger concerns, the importance of the doctrine of haecceitas for Heidegger's doctrine of individuality and facticity, etc. Much of this is a précis of John Van Buren. In a subsection on Univocity and Phenomenology, the author returns to his central thesis that "Heidegger's concept of being is ultimately univocal from the standpoint of Being and Time." Phenomenology is seen as genetic phenomenology of our concepts in experience. The road to the doctrine of a-letheia is seen to be made possible by Husserl's overcoming of truth as correspondence with the concept of evidence. Heidegger's criticisms of both Descartes and Kant on the thinking self are noted. The author touches on the passage from the primacy of the theoretical attitude to that of practical concern with the unifying term, care. This in turn deals with the ecstases of time. Heidegger's question is not Aristotle's; rather, it asks about the meaning of being. In section two of this chapter, taking his starting point from John Caputo's view that Heidegger held that "the scholastics were metaphysically naïve," he turns again to his own concerns with Deleuze.

In this study of Heidegger I want to maintain Deleuze's insight that univocity = immanence. What is at stake in my interpretation of Heidegger is the elaboration of a philosophy of immanence in Heideggerian terms. I have caught an arrow fired by Deleuze and have engaged in a reinterpretation (my italics) of Heidegger's thought as a result. (p. 51)

He then turns to a critical discussion of Sheehan's interpretation of Heidegger in terms of the doctrine of analogy.

Chapter three is titled "Univocity and Phenomenological Philosophy." The first part provides a very general discussion of time, phenomenon, and Husserl as background. There follows a section on univocity from 1916 to 1927, the connections between Husserl and Descartes, and a final summary on "Dasein, Univocity and the Question of Analogy." Here, the author draws some provisional conclusions in what amounts to a paraphrase of Heidegger: the whole tradition from Aristotle to Husserl fails to raise the question of being in a satisfactory manner, analogy remains an aporia, the tradition has confused Being with a being, and it confuses one entity as privileged over other entities, "be it God or the subject qua consciousness. Thus, analogy leads to ontotheology" (p. 90).

But what about 'Da-sein' one might ask? Is it not also privileged over other entities? Is it not the condition of analogy? (Otto Pöggler in The Paths of Heidegger's Life and Thought, [p. 156] argued in the 1920s for this privileged analogical role for Da-sein.) Yes, states the author, it is, but "Its privilege may however be regarded as part of the vestiges of the tradition that Heidegger had not yet overcome in Being and Time" (p. 90). All of this leads to the author's significant conclusion. Given that 'Da-sein' is a privileged entity, "how can we sensibly talk in terms of univocity?" He notes that Sheehan and Jacques Taminiaux are correct that there is a sense of the unity of being in Heidegger and that this is the unity of analogy. Yet, he concludes that for Heidegger being is primarily univocal. "This univocal sense of being is time and the point about univocity is a logical one, not a metaphysical one" (p. 91). That is, analogy presupposes univocity. Following Scotus, analogy logically presupposes univocity. In this way, for Heidegger, the diverse regions of being find an ontological foundation. Thus, the temporality of Da-sein as the transcendental horizon of being is univocal. "There is good evidence that Heidegger engaged in a reappropriation of analogy in the period of Being and Time" (p. 91). This remark is qualified on the next page: the reappropriation of analogy is done on "the logical basis of a univocal concept of being in terms of time. From a logical point of view analogy presupposes univocity." Yet, Being and Time is a criticism of the "logical point of view" as insufficient for asking "What is Metaphysics?".

Chapter four is titled "Univocity and Fundamental Ontology." It begins with a summary of Husserl's transcendental Idealism. Heidegger is seen to reject Husserl as a representative of the ontology of presence. The last part returns to a summary of the phenomenology of Da-sein and then the teaching on univocity. The former is conventional Heidegger doctrine. The latter is a recapitulation on "Univocity and Analogy." We can summarize as follows: the Greeks reduced full temporality to one mode, namely, the present. Those who read Heidegger in terms of analogy do not take account of "his temporal univocity of being." Yes, he does think of the unity of being in terms of analogy. For example, in the late 1920s animals and stones are in discrete analogy with the focal reference to Da-sein. In Aristotle, the latter was ousia; in Heidegger, it is Da-sein or rather Da-sein's understanding of being. "Da-sein's temporality, as transcendental condition, is the condition of possibility for the meaningfulness of being in toto" (p. 114). Reference is made to the final question in Being and Time in regard to time and being. The conclusion is that "Time is a univocal concept for Heidegger and being, since it is understood in terms of time, is understood univocally" (p. 114). This reference to the final question in the last lines of Being and Time raises issues. It does not give sufficient notice to the fact that Heidegger is asking a question; he is not making an ontological assertion. Again, the text is truncated at this point. Heidegger did not think that the language of transcendental thinking was adequate to the question of Being as he posed it.

Chapter five is titled "Univocity and Heidegger's Later Thought." It has two sections, the first is "Mysticism"; the second is "The Tradition". The first section is a very cursory account of Heidegger and Mysticism. It alludes to Heidegger and Eckhart, deals with some views of Caputo, and makes a contrast between what is commonly understood as philosophy (argument and reason) with Heidegger's post-Kehre move to "Thought." The author introduces Heidegger's idea of Ereignis. In regard to Eckhart, he repeats his view that the world of the medievals was essentially religious and adds: "The medieval scholastic philosopher, no less than the layperson, for which philosophy 'proper' was not an option, interpreted their world from the perspective of faith" (p. 118). This is true only if one equates "philosophy proper" with atheism. Early Heidegger adopted a "methodological" atheism of modern science. He declined to be called an atheist. Are there no faith-commitments of one kind or another present in modernity?

Various themes such as difference and aletheia, Socrates, the principle of sufficient reason and mysticism, the affinity between Eckhart and Heidegger, Being and Nothing, ontology and the reduction to a being, Da-sein and Being, are discussed.

There is to be no God perspective: "There is nothing beyond the immutable play of the revealing and concealing of being" (p. 129). Emphasis is placed on Space-Time as the site for epochal change.

What has emerged in my investigation of Heidegger's philosophy so far is that there is a fundamental univocal sense of being in his thought. That fundamental sense is meaningful presence or presencing. Ultimately, for Heidegger, the being of beings is the presence of that which is present. (p. 136)

There is no transcendent ground. Heidegger's return to the Presocratics is noted and the chapter ends with a contrast of modern Gestell with the medieval sense of analogical order.

Chapter six is titled "Univocity and the Problem of History." The author admits that it is difficult to read the univocity of being into the Later Heidegger. Again, the "Scotist-Deleuze" notion of univocity is invoked. Heideggerian Ereignis seems to be treated as "an event." But above all, the over-reaching Heideggerian "History of Being" with its eschatological tone is rejected and is replaced by an "archaeological hermeneutics" based on Michel Foucault and Gary Gutting. The author favors an advocacy of a relative a priori. He shows appreciation for the importance of Heidegger's lecture on the work of art. He recognizes the primacy of poetry in Later Heidegger and acknowledges that Heidegger has moved beyond "Metaphysics." But if Heidegger has moved beyond "Metaphysics," has he not also moved beyond "univocity"?

It is clear that the author speaks about salvaging what he can from the Heideggerian corpus. He will take what can be of use in constructing a radically immanentist philosophy which explicitly excludes the "divine," the self, and the world.

I am willing to grant the author that concerns about univocity are germane to the period up to and including Being and Time. But even here I have questions. Certainly, Heidegger's project was never a Metaphysics after the manner of Deleuze. And to impose a Deleuzean notion of univocity and immanence on Heidegger is an attempt to do violence to Heidegger's own project. The question of univocity in early Heidegger is a very good one. It is the merit of the author to have seen this influence of Scotus on early Heidegger. Later Heidegger, however, is another matter.