Heidegger, Morality and Politics: Questioning the Shepherd of Being

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Sonia Sikka, Heidegger, Morality and Politics: Questioning the Shepherd of Being, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 244 pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781108419796.

Reviewed by Karsten Harries, Yale University


Presenting itself as "an exegesis and friendly critique of Martin Heidegger's moral and political philosophy" (p. 1), this book is more than that: it is also a thought-provoking statement of Sikka's own position, a Heidegger-inflected moral realism. Free of the partisanship that mars so much of the Heidegger literature, the book demonstrates an admirable command of both the primary and the secondary literature, as also of such thinkers as Herder, Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Nietzsche. Sikka's aim is to challenge the claim that Heidegger's concern with the question of being has little to offer ethics. Given that aim, it is to be expected that she would challenge both those scholars who assert that there is no relationship and even more those who see an essential relationship between Heidegger's engagement with National Socialism and his philosophical thought. That engagement, Sikka claims, inexcusable as it is, should not blind us to what he still has to offer. Her aim is to "highlight what is of continuing value in Heidegger's moral and political philosophy," while in no way glossing over his many "foolish" and "morally culpable" "acts and sympathies" (p. 5). Special weight is placed on Heidegger's challenge to the fact/value distinction: "An implication of my analysis is that, for Heidegger, questions of truth are not separate from questions of right and wrong, in the normative sense of these terms, since being and goodness are intimately intertwined" (p. 1).

Instead of attempting to trace the evolution of Heidegger's thought, Sikka organizes it according to topics. Chapter 1 focuses on the 'how' of being moral. I agree with her that "the ideal of authenticity Heidegger outlines is decidedly an ethical one" (p. 12). The question is whether this ideal is not so empty as to offer no direction. Does Heidegger leave us with an empty freedom? Sikka resists that interpretation. She recognizes that "On its own, Heidegger's account of conscience provides no moral norms to guide action" (p. 14). How then should one act? "The answer depends on who a particular individual is, with his or her unique history and circumstances" (p. 15).

But situation and history speak with many voices: "There is scope for imagining the new, but imagination must have models with which to work. Thus, Heidegger's idea that authentic historical repetition may involve choosing a hero and 'loyally following in the footsteps of that which can be repeated' (BT 385)" (p. 20). "May" is rather weaker than Heidegger's indicative, and that he was able to choose Hitler for his hero suggests the disturbing emptiness of Heidegger's account of authentic historicality. As did Thomas Aquinas and Kant, Heidegger recognized that freedom must allow itself to be bound to be true freedom. He thus appeals to the "moment" of decision, "as when a person wants to say 'I did what I had to do' or 'I cannot do otherwise'" (p. 30). As Sikka points out, "we often judge courageous moral acts in which a person submits herself to this kind of necessity as exemplifying moral freedom" (p. 31). I grant Sikka that Heidegger's positive appropriation of Schelling "does help to clarify his understanding of freedom as well as his critique of subjectivism" (p. 37), but to understand genuine freedom as "placing oneself under the obligation to do what needs to be done at a given time" (p. 37) remains empty as long as that need remains quite undetermined.

Sikka addresses that issue in Chapter 2: "Is Humanity an End in Itself?" She here follows those who, like Charles Sherover, Lawrence Vogel, and Julian Young, have suggested that Heidegger's understanding of "authentic solicitude" (p. 40) or "authentic Mitsein" (p. 47) allows one to read Being and Time as an attempt "to uncover the phenomenological basis for Kant's view that the property of persons in virtue of which they are worthy of respect is freedom" (p. 47). But the textual basis for such an attractive reading of Being and Time is slight: there is tension between Heidegger's understanding of Dasein's being-with-others and of authenticity. Authentic solicitude, which frees the other to be his or her own authentic self, is taken to be exceptional and far removed from our everyday being with others. Like love, it places the unique individual above the universal. And when, in some tension with the preceding, Heidegger does come to speak explicitly of authentic Mitsein, he is thinking not of the individual affirming himself as belonging and responsible to the community of all human beings, but as member of a Volk (BT 384). Due to its formal character, the analytic of Dasein offered in Being and Time may perhaps permit, but hardly "entails liberating solicitude toward all persons" (p. 52). Kant seems distant, notwithstanding the suggestive way in which Sikka draws on him to bolster her reading of Heidegger.

In Chapter 3, "Animals and Other Beings," Sikka finds resources in Heidegger to support her claim that we have moral obligations towards both:

On this interpretation, there can be obligations of justice toward non-sentient beings not because they have their own interests, but because there is a way things best fit together to enable the well-being of all that lives on earth, including ourselves as the beings called upon to heed our essence by taking care of things. (p. 91)

Sikka here draws on the later Heidegger's understanding of man as the "shepherd of being" (pp. 58, 63), rather than as a subject seeking to master objects by means of science and technology. The call of conscience becomes now a call to consider "what is due to each being in light of what it is and within the design of what is as a whole" (p. 87). Sikka is well aware that with such thoughts she is leaving Heidegger behind. What he has to say about animals is not especially illuminating. But to support her position, she appeals to what she terms Heidegger's "moral realism," which is said to involve

a rejection of the distinction between fact and value. Understanding the 'facts' about living beings means understanding their telos, and assessing how individuals are doing in relation to that telos. For animals, unlike plants (as far as we can tell), that includes understanding their being driven towards what is good for them in such a way that they will feel the privations they encounter. (p. 86)

Justice for Heidegger, according to this interpretation, means "achieving appropriate relations between entities" (p. 94).

Drawing on Heidegger's "The Anaximander Fragment," Chapter 4, "Justice in Light of the Good," develops that interpretation. Sikka rejects what she calls "a popular misperception of Heidegger as a relativist or amoralist," agreeing with Julian Young and Frank Schalow that for Heidegger "the 'is' and the 'ought'" are inseparable. Human beings are said to "receive their binding directives from the 'truth of Being'" (p. 94), which is understood as "the character of entities in their proper natures and relations to one another," said to be "disclosed in light of a 'for-the-sake-of,' and this 'for-the-sake-of' does not lie 'in' things as they are actually configured. It lies 'beyond' them as the good form which they strive" (p. 99). It is clear that Heidegger rejects the attempt to master being in thought, which has presided over the progress of metaphysics and, in the form of science and technology, has embraced our modern life-world. But "the unlimited self-assertion of man as the calculating animal, and the endangerment of the essence of being in its degeneration to standing reserve, may be surmounted, along with the desolation of the earth delivered over to this conception of humanity and being" (p. 106).

Vaguely suggestive, this understanding of "Justice as Correspondence with Being" (p. 99) points in no clear direction. Sikka suggests that "implemented as a politics, this idea would promote a 'freeing' where every being is given the best possibility of achieving its 'essence,' of occupying the place to which it us best suited, while respectfully considerate of the rightful place of all others" (p. 109). That this, as Sikka calls it, "rather sunny picture of Heidegger's conception of justice" (p. 112) is difficult to reconcile with his once enthusiastic embrace of National Socialism, she acknowledges. But if the idea of justice she has developed is indeed implicit already in Being and Time, a claim that needs stronger support, the question must be raised: how are we to understand the many texts of the thirties that point in a very different direction -- as an aberration, due in part to the spell a misunderstood Nietzsche then cast on Heidegger? The discussion of authentic Mitsein in Being and Time, which links it to the choice of a hero, argues differently, as does Heidegger's refusal to disown National Socialism as he understood it, even as he soon came to understand the Nazis as just another phenomenon of the devastation of the earth the progress of metaphysics had to bring about.

One thing Heidegger never disowned is the way he tied authentic Dasein to rootedness in the history of a people and in a particular region. Sikka does a fine job of illuminating the way many of Heidegger's thoughts here were prefigured by romantic thinkers, especially, Herder, the later Fichte, Schleiermacher, and Müller. Related is the nostalgic celebration of Heimat, prominent in Heidegger's thinking from beginning to end. In keeping with this are Heidegger's denigrating comments on nomads, including the Jews, and his celebration of provincial, as opposed to metropolitan life. So is his celebration of Greek and German as the most powerful and spiritual, precisely because most rooted, languages, his conviction that "German culture had something special to offer to the world in the time of its great need" (p. 146). In keeping with her understanding of Heidegger's conception of justice, Sikka finds Heidegger affirming, even in the addresses and lectures during the Rectorate, "a model, of nations as singular cultural and political entities that interact while respecting each other's autonomy" (p. 146). That this is difficult to reconcile with much in his writings, she recognizes, but she thinks we should distinguish levels of principle and practice. That Heidegger soon came to recognize that the Nazis had betrayed and perverted the National Socialism he envisioned must be granted. But I would have welcomed a fuller discussion of the latter. That might have made clearer its connection with Being and Time. I suspect it would show its incompatibility with the benign justice Sikka finds in the Anaximander essay.

The question "Was Heidegger Racist" has come up too often for Sikka to avoid. She devotes Chapter 6 to it. While there can be no doubt about Heidegger's disgust "with the reductive biologism that characterized so much Nazi ideology" (p. 161), this does "not entail an unambiguous rejection of the notion of race. Nor does it seem to have ruled out the belief that Jews could not quite become full members of the German nation" (p. 167). Heidegger certainly did hold "appalling antisemitic views" (p. 167). Like other Nazi ideologues, he linked "Jews with a lack of rootedness" (p. 168). But while granting that there is a great deal in Heidegger's writings and actions that must be criticized, Sikka nevertheless finds "some truth in the idea that the individual identifies with a Volk in part through self-identification with a line of descent and that this idea is not by itself racist" (p. 180):

Respect for others requires recognizing the way they identify themselves rather than covertly attempting to absorb and assimilate. Refusing to admit the reality of any dimension of race cannot be the only way to defeat racism, as if it were impossible to respect others while acknowledging difference. (p. 180)

Heidegger seems quite distant from such sentiments, even if Sikka has found Heidegger's understanding of historicity and cultural and ethnic identity useful for her purpose (p. 182).

In their Davos Disputation, not mentioned in this book, Cassirer asked:

Is Heidegger willing to renounce all objectivity, this form of absoluteness, which Kant represented in the ethical realm, in the theoretical realm, and in the Critique of Judgment? Is he willing to retreat completely to the finite essence, or, if not, where for him is the breakthrough to this sphere?

Cassirer's question touched on what I, too, take be a central problem of Being and Time, and more generally of Heidegger's thinking as a whole. Eternal truths are explicitly denied by Heidegger, who argues that to lay claim to such truths we would have to prove first that there always will be human beings. But is Heidegger right to claim this? His position is clear, even as it invites question: "Because the kind of being that is essential to truth is of the character of Dasein, all truth is relative to Dasein's being" (BT 227). Both absolute truth and the absolute subject are declared to be relics of Christian theology that after the death of God philosophy ought to have left behind. But does Heidegger not thus leave behind what we first of all and most of the time mean by "truth"?

In her final chapter ("The Status of Reason"), Sikka addresses that question. A central place is given to Ernst Tugendhat's claim that Heidegger's concept of truth as disclosure does not capture what we mean by truth: what discloses itself must disclose itself as it is (p. 197). Heidegger later was to acknowledge that "that there was something misleading in his use of the term 'truth'" (p. 198). Heidegger does sketch an account of how truth as correctness can be derived from his supposedly more fundamental understanding of truth as disclosure. But his failure to do justice to Dasein's power of self-transcendence in reflection, and that is to say also to the infinite reach of freedom, renders it inadequate. I agree with Sikka and Heidegger that the conception of truth that presides over our science and technology fails to do full justice to reality, that we have to recognize modes of disclosure that do greater justice to persons and to nature. The experience of beauty here has a special significance (see p. 110). But if we are not to lose our place in our modern world, we have to recognize the legitimacy of the reason ruling it, even as we need to recognize its limits. Sikka has succeeded in showing that "Heidegger at least sometimes managed to think (erringly) what needed to be thought in his times, and that his path of thinking continues to point out directions worth following in ours" (p. 220). But to do so responsibly requires a revision of Heidegger's analytic of Dasein that provides a convincing answer to Cassirer's question.