Heidegger on Being Uncanny

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Katherine Withy, Heidegger on Being Uncanny, Harvard University Press, 2015, 250pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674416703.

Reviewed by Raoni Padui, St. John's College, Santa Fe


Is the notion of the uncanny (Unheimlich) an occasional and perhaps peripheral concept in Heidegger's work? Most of us who have read some Heidegger know that it plays a central role in the analysis of Angst in Being and Time but on the surface may appear to subside as a central theme in his analysis of the kind of being particular to the human being, that is, Dasein. Katherine Withy goes against this commonplace belief, arguing instead that "Each time he takes it up, it becomes more central to his account of human being" (11). Her book not only offers a systematic interpretation of many of the central passages on the uncanny in Heidegger but also argues for its paradigmatic importance in Heidegger's account of human existence. She argues that according to Heidegger, to be human inherently involves being uncanny. This insightful work will surely become an important one on this topic since it offers both a comprehensive account of uncanniness and a rigorous and scholarly defense of its central claims.

In the first chapter, Withy develops what is meant by the feeling of uncanniness, a feeling not easily described. Let us arrive at it obliquely, through an example. Have you ever repeated a word so many times so that it began to lose its sense? As the repetitions pile up, the signification breaks down, and what was simple and familiar becomes strange and uncommon through a process of de-familiarization. This estrangement of meaning is not total but still preserves traces of a now transformed familiarity. In this process, you may become aware of what was working in the background unnoticed, the coordinates of meaning and your being a participant in the act of sense-making. A strange sensation often accompanies such experiences, a discomfort regarding the very fact that things make sense and that this meaningful space is fragile and can break down easily. This is the feeling of the uncanny or at least one of the many ways in which it can be experienced or described.

This strange mix of familiarity and estrangement has been analyzed by many theorists, and throughout the first chapter, Withy traces the different ways in which these liminal states of disorientation have been theorized. She begins by treating Masahiro Mori's notion of the uncanny valley in robotics, moving to Ernst Jentsch's and Sigmund Freud's influential essays on the uncanny, through the concepts of the absurd in Albert Camus and Thomas Nagel, and arriving at Jonathan Lear's and Stanley Cavell's ironic and skeptical notions of uncanniness. Much is to be gained through these different topologies of uncanniness, and the eclecticism of Withy's chosen authors makes for a very interesting read. One wonders, given the remainder of the book's topics, why these figures rather than others have been singled out for treatment. One can imagine that an account of Kierkegaard's notions of dread or anxiety (the Danish Angest), which greatly influenced Heidegger, or an account of Lacan's treatments of both anxiety and Antigone would have fit the central topics of the book better than Nagel and Cavell. Regardless, there is much to learn from Withy's excursion through these authors' accounts of uncanniness.

The second chapter moves to Heidegger's account of the uncanny in Being and Time, showing how the argument for an ontological status of the notion differs from a psychological account of the feeling that may accompany uncanniness. Withy begins by analyzing the fundamental mood of angst, exhibiting how the collapse of significance in Heidegger's account of angst can disclose something fundamental about the human being. Withy argues that there is an often unnoticed doubling of angst in Heidegger: there is the fundamental mood or feeling and a deeper ontological structure at the ground of human existence (48). While the fundamental mood is disclosive and allows us to see something that may have otherwise remained hidden, Withy shows how there is something she calls "originary angst" which grounds falling in Being and Time. Since the mood of anxiety is an experience of a disruption of the character of average everyday dealing with entities, it is a modification of falling, which in turn is grounded upon an originary and ontological angst from which we fall. The reason this ground of falling is a form of angst is that there is something inherently opaque in it since the "whence" of Dasein's thrownness is obscure and can never be completely grasped. From this interpretation, Withy deduces several important conclusions regarding the finitude at the ground of what it means to be a human being, arguing that it "in fact coincides with Dasein's being" (79) and that "Being-in-the-world is angst" (80). Through this important notion of originary angst, Withy shows how an ontological form of uncanniness lies in Dasein's finitude: the whence of its thrownness withdraws from it, is fundamentally opaque, and therefore Dasein cannot get a full hold of its own ground. There is uncanniness at Dasein's ground, and falling is a falling from this uncanniness. These are bold interpretive claims that will prove controversial, but this chapter struck me as the strongest and most important one, with conclusions arrived at through careful interpretations of key passages in Being and Time.

The remainder of the book in many ways attempts to fully justify this ontologization of uncanniness through a close reading of Heidegger's treatments of the uncanny human being in two lecture courses he delivered in 1935 and 1942, published in English respectively as Introduction to Metaphysics and Hölderlin's Hymn "The Ister." In the third and fourth chapters, Withy develops a very close textual analysis of Heidegger's two interpretations in those lecture courses of the first choral ode of Sophocles' Antigone. There Heidegger famously translated deinon by unheimlich, and the claim by the choral ode that the human being is the most uncanny of all beings is given the ontological interpretation of uncanniness which concluded Withy's second chapter. In a masterfully scholarly manner that is both conversant with secondary sources and simultaneously deft at close textual analysis, Withy unpacks and illuminates Heidegger's difficult interpretations. One of the many virtues of these chapters is the way in which she is able to move back and forth between jargon-ridden "Heideggerianese" and straightforward argumentation. Heidegger scholarship is often plagued by the twin dangers of an interpretation or paraphrase so close to Heidegger's difficult language as to become a repetition with a small difference, or a violent transplantation of Heidegger's notions into a contemporary idiom with imposed distinctions that run the risk of distorting his ideas. Withy opts to solve the dilemma by doing both: she will sometimes work closely with Heidegger's language and sometimes step back and explain the same notions with different words and methods, a procedure I found exemplary and refreshing.

The fifth and final chapter turns to the heart of the matter: what are the ultimate causes for Dasein's being uncanny? Working with an analogy that takes her through Aristotle's four causes, Withy shows us why this question cannot receive any straightforward answer (204). Since one is asking about the originary withdrawal from which our sense-making activities arise, there is a problem of self-reflexive finitude that does not allow for a solution. Since there is something that conceals itself in the very ground of the fact that things make sense (in the openness to being, in Heidegger's language), asking about the very ground of sense-making will not yield satisfactory results. Withy thus concludes, with Heidegger:

What withholds itself from openness is precisely its finitude, and this withholding or refusal is Dasein's finitude. So uncanniness is the mysteriousness, concealment, or obscurity that makes us uncanny and so produces our finite openness. The mystery at our ground is the mysteriousness of how a mystery could be a ground (235-236).

Of course, this conclusion is unlikely to convince anyone who has not followed Heidegger's arguments for the groundlessness of Dasein's ground, but if one has, Withy is able to say a great deal about this mystery and to articulate it as much as possible without desecrating its putative mysteriousness.

While Withy is largely successful in arguing for the fundamental role of originary angst and for the fact that the being of the human is inherently uncanny for Heidegger, I would like to turn to some critical questions that arose while reading her book. The first involves the account of originary angst and how it, together with ontological uncanniness, serves to ground human finitude in terms of origin: "Originary angst is the birth of Dasein" (92). Following Arendt, whom she does not cite in connection to birth, Withy can only be deliberately working against Heidegger's privileging of the role of death in his account of finitude by stressing the way in which finitude is at the birth or origin, at the event in which meaningful presence comes to be. On her account, angst even becomes a kind of mythic origination: "This is the story of what it takes for there to be openness to being rather than not -- an origin myth, if you will" (88). Both Dasein, the meaningful space it inhabits (the world) and the relationship between Dasein and being itself originate here: "The original becoming manifest of the world is Dasein's coming to have a world, or the world coming to be" (89).

Of course, this allows for a close connection between the notion of originary angst and the account of the coming to be of the human in the choral ode of Antigone. But it clearly goes against the major tendencies of Being and Time, where the finitude that Withy argues for in originary angst is linked to death and to the future rather than to the past and to birth. Heidegger directly associates the notion of anxiety, in its more fundamental relationship to being-in-the-world itself, to anxiety in the face of death and of Dasein's very potentiality for being.[1] In fact, he goes as far as identifying being-towards-death with anxiety: "Being-towards-death is essentially anxiety [Das Sein zum Tode ist wesenhaft Angst]" (SZ 266/ BT 310). Given this fact, it is surprising that Withy is both able to identify it with the birth of Dasein and to not treat Heidegger's concept of being-towards-death or temporality in any detail. This is notable since Withy argues that originary angst is both the ground for Dasein's falling and of Dasein's finitude. But Heidegger directly states that it is anxiety in the face of death that we flee from in the movements of temptation, tranquilization, and alienation that characterize falling (SZ 254/ BT 298). Given that he also closely aligns the structure of Care with being-towards-death and both with the primacy of an authentic future rather than past temporality (SZ 329/ BT 378), Withy's treatment of finitude without reference to death or the future will strike many readers of the second division of Being and Time as strange. I suspect that there may be an interesting way to harmonize the account of finitude in terms of birth, past, and origin and in terms of death, future, and possibility (and there are resources for doing so in section 72 of Being and Time), but here it is presented without any acknowledgment of the seriousness of these difficulties.

Once Withy turns to the interpretations of the choral odes, it does make a great deal more sense to treat the accounts as stories of origination. But here Withy thinks of the origin stories as origin myths and does not sufficiently engage in the role history (understood as the history of being) plays for Heidegger's account of origination: "The ode is indeed an origin story, but the origin it tells is not a historical origin. The story is not ontic but ontological: it is an account of the human essence or what it means to be human" (102-103). Of course, it is not an origin story in the sense of empirical history described by historiography, but one wonders whether it is appropriate to apply criteria of the Heidegger of the twenties to assess a work of the forties. For Withy's claim that the origin "is not ontic but ontological" is a complaint that would work in the texts from 1925-1929, but after Heidegger has systematically problematized both the ontological difference and the project of fundamental ontology, such a complaint is no longer as simple or clear. And to think the human essence without thinking the origin historically does not make any sense for one of Heidegger's texts of the forties, when he is fully engaging with the history of being and thinking origination in a thoroughly historical manner.

Withy presupposes that Heidegger's thought can be understood as continuous (241), a controversial claim she takes up from Thomas Sheehan but does not argue for sufficiently. Withy interprets a work of the forties with the same coordinates that she interprets Being and Time, sidestepping completely the problem of how the history of being may be transforming or refining the notions of angst and the uncanny. For example, in the "Letter on 'Humanism'", Heidegger states that in order to understand estrangement and homelessness, "it is necessary to think that destiny in terms of the history of being [ist es nötig, dieses Geschick seinsgeschichtlich zu denken]."[2] The relative silence regarding the problematic of history in Withy's book becomes even more striking when one thinks of how important history is for one of her main texts, namely, the 1942 seminar on Der Ister in which Heidegger denies that the human can be thought as "human beings in general" and rather claims that "throughout these remarks, we always mean the essence of the historical human beings of that history to which we ourselves belong."[3] A little further Heidegger even remarks that "Historicality [Geschichtlichkeit] is the distinctive mark [Auszeichnung] of that humankind whose poets are Sophocles and Hölderlin."[4] It follows that a fully successful treatment of Heidegger's account of the essence of the human being in these later texts cannot fail to engage with his account of the history of being.

Finally, there is an omission that is particularly striking today, when the ripples of Heidegger's Schwarze Hefte are still being felt. Two of the three main texts discussed by Withy are deeply political texts written at crucial moments of Heidegger's political life: 1935 and 1942. Both include not only direct political claims about Americanism, Bolshevism, and the inner truth and greatness of National Socialism but also an ontological understanding of concepts initially taken from political domains, including long articulations of what a polis, a State, and a homeland mean. Furthermore, they both engage in one of the most central and influential texts about ethics and politics: Sophocles' Antigone. Given all of this, it was striking to me that Withy said almost nothing regarding the political register in which Heidegger's texts were working. Her book would be much stronger if it included a treatment of politics and its relationship to ontology. In the end, then, the overall success of this book may come down to how one weighs sins of omission against sins of commission, so to speak. What it does, it does very well and convincingly, but insofar as it omits an argument for the continuity thesis in Heidegger's work that it presupposes and largely ignores the dimensions of history and politics for some of the central texts it treats, it may leave some readers dissatisfied. It will without a doubt remain a central text in the topic of the uncanny in Heidegger for years to come.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Being and Time, translated by John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson (New York: Harper and Row, 1962), 295; Sein und Zeit (Tübingen: Max Niemeyer Verlag, 2006), 251. Hereafter cited as BT and SZ respectively.

[2] Martin Heidegger, "Letter on 'Humanism,'" in Pathmarks, edited by William McNeill (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998), 258; Wegmarken, Gesamtausgabe, Band 9 (Franfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1976), 339.

[3] Martin Heidegger, Hölderlin's Hymn "The Ister," translated by William McNeill and Julia Davis (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1996), 43; Hölderlins Hymne "Der Ister," Gesamtausgabe, Band 53 (Frankfurt Am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1984), 51.

[4] Ibid., 56, GA 53: 69.