Heidegger on Concepts, Freedom and Normativity

Placeholder book cover

Sacha Golob, Heidegger on Concepts, Freedom and Normativity, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 270pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107031708.

Reviewed by Scott M. Campbell, Nazareth College of Rochester


In this engaging and tightly argued book, Sacha Golob defends a unique thesis about Heideggerian intentionality. In doing so, he situates Heidegger's early work (1919-1935) in a dialogue with Husserlian readings of Heidegger's philosophy as well as with contemporary analytic thinkers. The book takes up important philosophical questions about meaning, freedom, and authenticity that will be of interest to anyone inclined toward philosophy.

The book has six chapters. The first three advance Golob's new way of thinking about intentionality. He concludes that the project outlined in Being and Time ultimately fails because Heidegger does not provide an account of temporality that is nuanced or differentiated enough to describe the contexts of meaning that we use to understand objects. The last three chapters aim to explain Heidegger's thinking after Being and Time in light of that failure, but then they also return to themes from that text. In these chapters, Golob takes up the notions of freedom and normativity, which leads him to analyze a panoply of important Heideggerian notions, such as truth, authenticity, anxiety, and death.

A close reading of this book will be richly rewarded, but for the sake of simplicity, let me paint with a broad brush. I take Golob to be proposing three main theses. The first is that Heidegger's idea of intentionality is conceptualist and yet non-propositional. By intentionality, Golob simply means, "a property, typically attributed to mental states, whereby those states are directed toward or about something" (6). Against many other commentators on Heidegger, this book argues that the basic level of experience for Heidegger, what Golob calls throughout the book "the explanatorily primary level of Heideggerian intentionality," contains conceptual content. In making this claim, Golob is distancing himself from those who equate conceptual and propositional intentionality (104), which then allows him to advance his next thesis. He writes, "I am going to claim that the core of Heidegger's account of nonpropositional, conceptual intentionality rests on the idea of a prototype" (109). Thus, Golob's second main thesis is that - against Kant's critical framework but consistent with Plato's theory of forms - Heidegger's intentionality employs a basic prototype approach. In Being and Time, that prototype is time. These two theses are fleshed out in the first three chapters, which constitute, in my judgment, the heart of the book. The fourth chapter uses the prototype approach to explain Heidegger's theory of truth, but the next thesis emerges in Chapters five and six, where Golob claims that, "freedom is the capacity to commit oneself to norms" (195). By looking at Dasein's freedom in normative terms, that is, by saying that Dasein operates "within a normative terrain" (213), Golob can then recast authenticity and inauthenticity in those terms. As such, and this I take to be the third main thesis of the book, authenticity is a matter of understanding the normative terrain in which Dasein operates, in other words, authentic Dasein, "accurately understands its own nature: i.e. it makes sense of itself . . . in a way that reflects the facts about Dasein that texts such as [Being and Time] have supposedly identified" (214).

As one who has now traveled along the paths beaten by this engaging and provocative book, I do want to provide something of a guidepost. The Introduction claims that the author will show that while "Dasein's primary intentionality is conceptual, it is nevertheless nonpropositional" (2). But then roughly the first seventy pages, encompassing Chapters one and two, make the case that "there is no class of content such that it cannot be captured by propositions" (67). Golob goes to great lengths to show that for Heidegger the explanatorily basic level of experience has conceptual content and can be rendered in propositions, even scientific propositions (64), that do not distort that experience. We find him asserting in Chapter one, for example, that "the primary level of Dasein's intentionality is not nonconceptual and nonpropositional" (28), and we even find him defending "the view that all intentionality is propositional" (34). In light of his contention in the Introduction, this was confusing, at least until Chapter three, where we learn that Heideggerian intentionality is conceptual but can be nonpropositional.

Nonetheless, Golob is raising a fascinating and important mulitfaceted question here, which I might synthesize in the following way: do concepts, propositions, and assertions in some way distort or diminish our basic way of experiencing the world? Golob writes, "One of the classic arguments for nonconceptual content is that certain experiences, in particular perception, are somehow so rich or diffuse or fine-grained that they cannot be captured in language" (10). This is an important expression, which surfaces numerous times throughout the text. Golob catalogs an array of positions by thinkers who claim that for Heidegger, language fails to do justice to the richness of human experience. The conceptualist reading of Heidegger advanced by Golob depends on how we understand what Heidegger says in Being and Time about present-at-hand entities and about the notion of assertion. Golob carefully dissects various ways of conceiving what is meant by the present-at-hand, but the gist of his argument is that concepts, assertions, and propositions do not necessarily cut an entity off from the context of meaningful relations in which it is embedded and so do not necessarily render the entity present-at-hand.

To take just a few examples, he argues that assertions might preserve an entity's relationship to its context (20); that the conceptual is not necessarily a "detached or deliberate or explicit or self-conscious experience" (30); that skills or savoir faire, which Hubert Dreyfus says are nonpropositional, "need only be cashed as the capacity to apply one proposition rather than another" (34) (meaning that "the skill is not a mode of intentionality" 34n84); and that cognition is not simply a matter of staring at entities but is rather an "active process" that does not involve "a suspension of practical concerns" (38-39). But the most important ideas relate to what Golob, referring to Taylor Carman and Mark Wrathall, has termed the Carman-Wrathall model, which argues that for practical, normative, and perceptual reasons, "propositions are unable to capture the distinctive content present at the primary level of experience" (40). On Golob's reading, they say this because, first, our primary comportments and behaviors are practically and not conceptually oriented (43-44), second, our basic, fundamental level of experience cannot be either true or false (44), and, third, the primary level of intentionality involves a kind of perceptual, sensory-motor experience that is either too vague or too rich to be grasped in propositions.

Interestingly, Golob's responses to these claims chiefly take the form of questions: "what sense of 'practical' is in play here such that it is opposed to 'conceptual or logical'?" (43-44); "why . . . can't the instrumental chains beloved by Heidegger be captured in propositional terms?" (44); "why could this pursuit of ends and competence not be analysed in terms of, rather than opposed to, my possession of the relevant concepts?" (44); "why can I not simply assert propositions such as 'these entities stand in a normative relation other than truth'?" (45). In other words, in this key section of the text, Golob does not so much argue as implore his interlocutors to see something that seems quite clear to him. Why is it that Golob views things so differently than Carman, Wrathall, Dreyfus, and others? It may have something to do with what they are looking for. Golob says that the "Carman-Wrathall model aims to identify some feature x which both explains why the explanatory primary form of Dasein's intentionality is nonpropositional and why such intentionality cannot be captured by a proposition" (43). Is Heidegger looking for an explicit x?

Consider what he says in "The Origin of the Work of Art" about color. He writes, "Color shines and wants only to shine. When we analyze it in rational terms by measuring its wavelengths, it is gone. It shows itself only when it remains undisclosed and unexplained."[1] The same can be said about experience, even in the early Heidegger, where he was concerned about the ways that language, including discussion, distorts experience. Golob insists that when Heidegger says that propositions diminish our experiences, he has in mind "a particular philosophical approach" (53-54). That approach, he says, is when an assertion is "subject to 'logical' analysis" (54). But when we look back at Heidegger's early lecture courses, we see that he was very much concerned about the ways in which ordinary language, even just recounting what happened to you during the day, modifies and even distorts the original experience.[2] Thus the issue is not with whether certain experiences cannot be captured by concepts and propositions. All experiences are subject to linguistic articulation, but when we do so, something is lost. The original experience is modified, distorted or leveled down in some way. Here is an example that may resonate with anyone reading this review. The conceptual apparatus used in teaching evaluations may tell us something about what happened in a classroom, but they will never grasp the experience that students had taking the class. One can argue, and Golob does (64), that in using propositions and assertions in his own work, Heidegger (on the dominant view that Golob is criticizing) is engaging in the very objectification, distortion, and leveling down that he opposes, resulting in a paradox or contradiction. But this passes over his endless attempts at developing neologisms and inventive linguistic innovations, which were designed to resist the conceptual leveling down that he thought plagued language itself.

In Chapter three, which is the longest and most complicated, Golob builds upon his claim that the primary level of Heideggerian intentionality necessarily, though not exclusively, contains conceptual content. The two nonconceptual elements of that intentionality are objects and moods. This is a remarkable chapter, providing an in-depth analysis of the basic contextual structure of intentionality in Being and Time, carefully explaining what it means for Heidegger to make the hermeneutic claim that we understand "a as b," that is, that we understand an entity "a" in terms of its context "b." For Heidegger, we must have some familiarity with that context in terms of which we understand entities. Golob argues that that context cannot itself be an entity, or else we would need some other context in order to understand it. To avoid this infinite regress, we must have some apriori familiarity with that context. Golob does not mention the hermeneutic circle here, which might solve the problem of infinite regress. Nonetheless, Golob's account here is highly innovative. He discerns in Heidegger a prepropositional and yet conceptual level of meaning, which he calls "a new depth grammar." It is a grammar because the prepropositional content may be expressed in propositions without any loss of meaning, as both contain identical conceptual content. This innovation is the prototype model.

For Golob we are able to locate entities within a relational context, that is, we are able to locate the "a" variable within the "b" variable, because of "a prior familiarity with a prototype that exemplifies the relations that define those contexts" (109). Golob uses the example of a hat to introduce the way in which one's nonpropositional exposure to the hat can familiarize one with the different relations according to which we make sense of similar entities (109). He then argues that the prototype in Being and Time is time. Importantly, the prototype cannot be an entity, due to the infinite regress mentioned above. It must be ontological and thus not a being.

In my judgment, this prototype approach has remarkable potential to explain Heidegger's thinking, especially his use of examples, which are often the most illuminating and instructive aspects of his thought. But how can time be a prototype? A prototype, such as the hat, is particular, an example serving as a model, and it is an entity. I do not see how a prototype can be general and not an entity, which is why I also do not see the links between the prototype model and the Platonic forms (123-135). I wish that Golob had not used the term "prototype" in his definition of prototype (109). In the discussion of Plato, he talks about the Platonic "ideas as prototypes" (133), but, again, this does not fit with Golob's example of the hat. Copies of the hat must look exactly like the prototypical hat. For Plato, however, hats can come in many different shapes, sizes, and colors, and yet still participate in the form or idea of hat. Ultimately, I do not see how time or even modes of time like Temporalit├Ąt and Zeitlichkeit can serve as prototypes because they are general. Golob might have gone in a different direction here, using the prototype approach to explain how Heidegger uses specific examples, such as the bridge that extends over the Neckar River in Heidelberg in "Building Dwelling Thinking," to show how phenomenological descriptions of specific things can familiarize us with meaningful contexts, opening up space and a world in which to dwell.

Golob's understanding of what Heidegger means by Being is different from what many scholars of Heidegger take it to mean, and I think he knows this. The book is meant to offer a new, and controversial, way of thinking about Heidegger's work. So, when Golob talks about truth, he deviates from the more common understanding of truth in Heidegger as unconcealment prior to correctness and incorrectness by saying that Heidegger is a minimal representationalist whose notion of truth must contain "accuracy conditions" (180). Golob argues that for Heidegger, truth involves meaning, and thus understanding, and something can always be understood either correctly or incorrectly (183). As such, to understand Being involves the correct or incorrect understanding of the properties of a thing, which constitute its essence (184). For Golob, an entity cannot simply be disclosed or given. It must be contextualised, the "a" variable must be located within the "b" variable, and with the "a as b" structure an accuracy condition is operative (183).

A Heideggerian response to this would be to say that the properties of a thing do not constitute its Being. Properties are beings, entities, and so are ontic on Heidegger's terms, not ontological. But Golob's approach to Heidegger is conceptual through and through. Even moods are conceptual: "their role is to articulate essentially conceptual structures" (207). When he talks about authenticity and freedom, he sees these as involving self-understanding within a normative terrain and thus within the "space of reasons" (220). Golob surely is right when he says that one can be authentic against the backdrop of a social world dominated by "the one" (217-218). But then he views anxiety as a "conceptual state" wherein one is disconnected or separated from a "web of interrelated tools and tasks" (227) that is still there but no longer has "normative force" for you (233). Authenticity then "requires a full understanding of Dasein, and by extension of the basic contours of the space of reasons" (218), and the "demand" to be authentic becomes "a necessary precondition on philosophy" (241). Concluding, Golob views Heidegger as saying that authenticity is important because it is essential for doing good philosophy. But Heidegger is not trying to say that "all activity is philosophy, and all value is philosophical value" (242). He was not trying to make human existence more philosophical, he was trying to connect philosophy to human existence. My worry is that Golob's understanding of Heidegger is too theoretical, too conceptualist, which is why he claims that authenticity in "Heidegger's perspective is profoundly theoretical" (242) and why he makes the practical awareness of savoir faire or know-how into a knowledge affair: "it is the know . . . that makes possible the how" (140, emphasis in original).

Whether you agree with the arguments in this book or not may depend on how you understand concepts. My sense is that the Carman-Wrathall model thinks of a concept as "an explicit or thematic or systematic understanding" of something, which is how Golob says we should not think about the concept, mainly because if we did, then Kant's categories would not be concepts (9). But even Kant says that the categories are special concepts. Golob appeals to Kant's notion of concept, but then in his definition, Golob employs the very language that he argues against. He says that the content of a concept "is not qualitatively rich or diffuse or fine-grained in a way that prohibits its expression in any declarative sentence" (10). I think this begs the question, since Golob's point is that there is no content so "rich or diffuse or fine-grained" that it cannot be stated in concepts. But maybe this does not matter. At the heart of this book is a question with a long philosophical history: do concepts (or assertions, or propositions), as James might say, still the stream of experience? Golob's engaging and thought-provoking answer makes an important contribution to a new chapter in the history of that question, one from which both analytic and continental thinkers will profit greatly.

[1] Heidegger, Martin. "The Origin of the Work of Art," translated by Albert Hofstadter in Basic Writings, edited by David Farrell Krell (Harper Collins, 1977, 1993).

[2] See GA 58 Basic Problems of Phenomenology: Winter Semester 1919/1920, tr. Scott M. Campbell (Bloomsbury, 2013), pp. 90-91.