Heidegger on East-West Dialogue: Anticipating the Event

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Lin Ma, Heidegger on East-West Dialogue: Anticipating the Event, Routledge, 2008, 268pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415957199.

Reviewed by Eric Sean Nelson, University of Massachusetts Lowell


Lin Ma's Heidegger on East-West Dialogue is a rigorous, detailed, and attentive study of Martin Heidegger's complex, ambiguous, and overly interpreted relations with Eastern thought. In this work, Ma meticulously interrogates Heidegger's constructions of the "Asiatic" and the "Eastern," his references to Asian words, texts, and traditions, and his interactions with individuals from China, Japan, and -- to a lesser extent -- South and Southeast Asia. In this carefully crafted inquiry, Ma examines the texts and contexts of Heidegger's occasional references to Eastern thought and Asia. This includes remarks that have been discussed multiple times in previous literature without sufficient attention to their context and trajectory. She also considers a number of previously unexamined remarks from recently published works and collections of correspondence. This book is indispensable reading for anyone interested in the actuality and possibilities of Heidegger's thinking with respect to Eastern and intercultural philosophy.

Ma offers a critical and balanced -- and accordingly less speculative and optimistic -- assessment of Heidegger's interest in Eastern thought and his import for East-West and intercultural dialogue. Through a meticulous reading of the texts, she convincingly and forcefully -- indeed, devastatingly for overly indulgent interpretations -- reveals the stakes and limits of Heidegger's actual interest in and import for Eastern thought. Heidegger never carefully distinguishes the various cultures nor the varieties of what he considers Eastern thought, which is neither philosophy (metaphysics) nor genuinely inceptive thinking insofar as these both concern Being. Likewise, Heidegger's significance for intercultural thought has been uncritically appropriated and imaginatively exaggerated in East and West.

This book is not another creative yet ahistorical work in "comparative philosophy," which is one of the dangers of cross-cultural philosophy. Ma traces how Heidegger influenced East Asian intellectuals and how they drew connections between Heidegger's thinking and Eastern traditions that in turn shaped the context of the question of Heidegger and the East and the formation of "resonances" between them. It should be noted, however, that previous interpreters have been more aware of these difficulties than admitted in this work, which is precisely why they stressed and over-emphasized the few resonances, influences, and connections that they recognized.

Ma examines Heidegger's writings with reserve and attention to their content and contexts, and also the large amount of secondary literature devoted to Heidegger and the East, beginning with Heidegger's early reception in Japan in the 1920's and 1930's. She rightly dismantles and demystifies much of this literature. There is much less of Buddhism and Daoism in Heidegger than the secondary writings suggest, some of which infer a hidden Eastern thread running through Heidegger's thinking. On careful reading, the few actual remarks and passages of Heidegger reflect his own philosophical and cultural preoccupations and little concern for Asian texts, contexts, or even for his Asian students and interlocutors. Although these individuals developed original works of their own, Heidegger does not take interest in this dimension of their thought or underestimates and misinterprets them. Despite occasional expressions of interest in Eastern languages and texts, Heidegger never engaged in a systematic and sustained inquiry into them. The one serious potential counterexample of his brief study and "co-translation" of the Daodejing confirms his lack of sustained effort. He broke it off, either -- according to Heidegger himself on different occasions -- because of difficulties with the translator Paul Shih-Yi Hsiao or due to the radical alienness of the Chinese language. This radical alienness is not merely an empirical issue of the difficulty of learning Eastern languages; it reflects an ontological incommensurability between East and West and for which neither is prepared.

The Daodejing is the only Eastern text mentioned and discussed multiple times in Heidegger's published works. His uses of it reflect his own philosophical preoccupation with the question of Being, emptiness, and language, so that he freely adopts the translations according to his own linguistic priorities without considering its Daoist or Chinese contexts. This is undoubtedly true of his uses of the other principal text associated with early philosophical Daoism: the Zhuangzi. The biggest gap in Ma's book is the somewhat surprising lack of detailed consideration of the Zhuangzi, especially given how exactingly the other connections and influences are examined, and its crucial role in Reinhard May's argument for Heidegger's indebtedness to Chinese and Japanese thought in Heidegger's Hidden Sources.[1]

Heidegger and Heidegger scholars have linked Heidegger's Weg (way) and Laozi's dao (way). Although they are both literally translated as "way," and Heidegger knew of and played with the significance of dao, it is unclear whether they mean the same thing or "resonate" in any lucid manner given their radically divergent contexts and uses. Heidegger himself is ambivalent about "dao." Dao appears like logos, Sein (Being), and Ereignis (enownment or non-ontic event) to be a guiding word yet it cannot have the same meaning as Weg since dao is not a guiding word of philosophy or thinking. Likewise, Ma argues that there is no compelling identity to be articulated between the Chinese word translated as being (you) and Heidegger's Being (Sein). Nor is there between Daoist emptiness (wu) and Buddhist emptiness (kong), much less Heidegger's nothing (Nichts); although I would add that these can be used to illuminate each other in their differences without presupposing a direct connection or indirect resonance.

Ma stresses the concreteness and contextuality of Laozi's emptiness, as a functional part of the working of things, in contrast with the abstractness of Heidegger's nothing but then seemingly undermines this point by appealing to Pei Wei's (CE 267-300) critique of the abstractness and mystification of emptiness in Daoism. It is unclear, but perhaps the author wants to distinguish the concreteness of emptiness in the Daodejing from its abstraction in the later third-century Daoist thinkers of the xuanxue ("dark learning") and in Heidegger. Here she would be following Confucian critics such as Pei Wei, who wrote On the Exaltation of Being (Chong you lun) that decries the emphasis on nothingness. Ma shows how Heidegger takes liberties with German translations of the Daodejing, which are themselves problematic, and considers contemporary scholarship and recently discovered earlier versions of the Daodejing that make Heidegger's interpretation even less plausible.

Heidegger's remarks concerning the East occur in Greco-German and European contexts. Heidegger's reading the question of Being or its absence, as well as his forced interpretations of Chinese and Japanese words, is construed as dialogue, and his seemingly positive remarks are overemphasized while the negative are ignored. In such portrayals, Heidegger is interpreted as a universalistic, egalitarian, or pluralistic thinker of common humanity, of perspectives from divergent yet somehow equal primordial sources, or of radical multiplicity. These overlook Heidegger's crucial claim that there is only one event (Ereignis) and only one beginning, and it is Greek.

Heidegger's language has been interpreted as implying an alterity or radical difference that potentially includes multiplicity (i.e., the non-Western), but the difference that matters for Heidegger is immanent or internal to the origin and cannot be located elsewhere. Whether it is philosophy and thinking, the first and other beginning, the overcoming of metaphysics and thoughtful remembrance, or technological and poetic dwelling, these do not concern or address non-Western sources insofar as they are first and foremost about Greek origins.

For Heidegger, Being is persistently a question of the German (in the 1930's and early 1940's) and later European and Western confrontation with the history of Being from its Greek origins to modern technology. In relation to this unique Western history of Being, and its needed transformation through confronting that history, the Eastern is constructed as an ahistorical realm. Eastern ways of thinking and living are secondary and derivative to a historical transformation that can only be a Western self-transformation. Even though East Asian words and persons are mentioned more frequently than the Judaic, Islamic, or African in Heidegger's comments, the Eastern is separated and postponed to an indefinite future dialogue for which we are unprepared.

Heidegger is concerned with how Eastern traditions supposedly deemphasize the privilege of the human -- as the guardian of the clearing and openness of Being -- and links the East with the irrational, mystic, and nihilistic. The author raises but does not draw out the context and implications of a number of issues raised by Heidegger's stressing the priority of humans as the guardians of the clearing in response to what he interprets as the equality of beings in Eastern traditions. Such a discussion could shed important light on the contested issue of humanism and anthropocentrism in his thought.

Whereas the West is world-historic, the East -- despite its long practice of writing history and its significance in Confucian thought -- is unlike the West in being fundamentally ahistorical. "Asia" and the "Asiatic" are identified with Soviet Russia in the 1930's, and associated with impersonal and barbaric multitudes. The rhetoric of the "Asiatic" indicates a radical alienness, fatalism, and threat. Ancient Greece, Germany in the 1930's, and the contemporary West must overcome the Asiatic by staying within themselves and returning to what is properly their own calling. Whereas Hegel argued that the Asiatic was sublimated into the Greek, Heidegger demands radical opposition and overcoming of its slavish fatalism and barbaric mythos.

Heidegger connects Asia with "dark fire" in 1962. Ma speculates that this might be the heavenly fire and might indicate that Heidegger assumes a less negative tone in the 1960's. This claim is ambiguous given Heidegger's previous connecting of the Asiatic with the darkness of the irrational, which might nevertheless be driven by its own flame, and his emphasis elsewhere on guarding the dark from false brightness and illumination. However, Heidegger notes that this is a fire to be reordered rather than guarded: "The Asiatic element once brought to Greece a dark fire, a flame that their [i.e., Greek] poetry and thought reordered with light and measure."[2]

Heidegger's lack of concern for genuine East-West dialogue, in the name of a depth of dialogue that can never be enacted in empirical or ontic communication, is demonstrated in the last two chapters through an extended analysis of "A Dialogue on Language: Between a Japanese and an Inquirer." Heidegger's fictionalized dialogue cannot be taken as a record of a conversation as it modifies factual details and the actual conversation with Tezuka Tomio -- who indicated that this dialogue did not represent him and which he found one-sided and forced -- on which it was purportedly based. This work is not a dialogue in which the Western thinker can learn from or change his mind because of anything said by the fictionalized Japanese interlocutor, who only begins to think when he speaks the language of Heidegger, and who provides (often misconstrued) Japanese examples to illustrate points in Heidegger's thinking.

Heidegger contends that more dialogue under modern technological conditions perpetuates enframing (Ge-stell), according to which everything is a mobilized resource of standing-reserve (Bestand). Another more primordial way of saying (Sage) is needed. Heidegger's model of dialogue is a monologue of Being's own saying with itself, the appropriating or enowning event (Ereignis) to itself, or of the Greek origin with itself. This saying only occurs in Western languages and particularly in Greek and German. The linguistic ethnocentrism of the mid- and later Heidegger cannot be bracketed and his approach to Being and language retained. Its particular unique configuration is central to his argument given the formative world-disclosing essence of words. The uniqueness of Being and language in the West precludes drawing any general conclusions about a universalism or homeless cosmopolitanism that includes all human languages or relativism between an incommensurable multiplicity of languages.

"Homecoming" in Heidegger does not proceed through any foreign locale but through the "properly foreign" (i.e., Greece) rather than the alien Asiatic. The morning-land (Morgenland) that matters for the modern West or evening land (Abendland) is Greece and not a land in Asia. Heidegger's onetime and atypical remark concerning "the few other great beginnings" occurs in the context of the fourfold (Ge-viert) of gods and mortals, heaven and earth, which Heidegger articulates exclusively in relation to Greece and Hölderlin. Other beginnings do not plausibly refer to non-Western sources. The Greek-European dialogue could be interpreted as a model for intercultural encounter and dialogue. But it is not and cannot be one given Heidegger's stress on the uniqueness of the Western history of Being from metaphysics to modern technology, which is where the danger and the saving power within the danger both arise.

Heidegger's Eurocentrism is not necessarily excusable by being anti-modern and suspicious of Westernization in the sense of intensifying technology, rationalization, and globalism. Heidegger mentions how this planetary civilization rooted in Western metaphysics has impacted the East and the world, and interpreters consequently sense that there is an anti-Eurocentric dimension to his thinking. This is correct to the extent that the West is identified with modernity and globalization; it is incorrect insofar as the West is still inherently beholden to its Greek beginnings. For the sake of both West and East, Europe must encounter again anew and renew its origins, which are Greek. While the West awaits the saving power, the world awaits the renewal of the West from out of itself and only then can a genuine encounter and dialogue take place. Whereas an earlier generation of Japanese philosophers interpreted Heidegger as a "necessary detour" for rethinking Zen Buddhism, Heidegger warns in the Spiegel interview of "any takeover (Übernahme) of Zen Buddhism or any other Eastern experiences of the world." Even when East-West dialogue is introduced as a possibility, it is left undetermined for the future. Heidegger's strategy of anticipating the event of such an encounter and dialogue, while concurrently deferring it into the distant future in the name of a preparation through exclusively Greek origins, precludes its enactment. It inhibits acknowledging and reflecting on the fact that such encounters and dialogues have been and are already underway from ancient Greece to modernity.

[1] Reinhard May, Heidegger's Hidden Sources: East Asian Influences on His Work, London: Routledge, 1996.

[2] Martin Heidegger, Sojourns: The Journey to Greece, Albany: State University of New York Press, 2005, p. 27.