Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education

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Iain D. Thomson, Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 224pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 052161659x.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom, Boston University


This impressive study argues that Heidegger's deconstruction of metaphysics as ontotheology, when suitably understood, provides the key to his misunderstood critique of technology and to the underappreciated potential of his thought to contribute to efforts to respond to "our own growing crisis in higher education." The author is well versed in Heidegger's thought and the extensive secondary literature on it and he puts this expertise to superb use in a text that is lucidly written with intelligence, verve, and conviction. There is always room for criticism (see infra) of an undertaking this ambitious. But, whatever the merits of these reservations, this book makes a strong case for the enduring significance of Heidegger's later thought at the crossroads of technology and education.

The book's structure facilitates the argument for this significance. Following the opening account of the meaning of ontotheology in Heidegger's thought (Chapter 1), Thomson appeals effectively in Chapter 2 to the ontotheological basis of Heidegger's technological essentialism to vindicate it from traditional criticisms, most recently and effectively advanced by Andrew Feenberg. In Chapter 4 (the book's final chapter) he taps Heidegger's discussion of Plato's conception of paideia for the potential to resolve the current pedagogical crisis. Since Heidegger's later work (encompassing his essays on technology) have been disparaged for supposed links to his engagement with National Socialism and since that engagement was deeply tied to Heidegger's concern for reform of the university, Thomson devotes Chapter 3 to "Heidegger and the Politics of the University." Thomson maintains that Heidegger learned a philosophical lesson from this fatal experience, but not one that entailed abandoning his program for higher education. Thomson's challenging aim is to demonstrate the positive potential of Heidegger's critique of metaphysics for pedagogical concerns today. That positive potential, he submits, is "a species of philosophical perfectionism," only accessible once the aspects of his earlier view responsible for "his disastrous politics" have been identified and rejected (5).

Chapter 1 begins by noting the importance that Heidegger accords metaphysics as providing the "foundational justification" for intelligibility within a certain epoch. On the problem of providing a theory across epochs, Thomson thinks that Heidegger came to recognize that "there is no substantive, transhistorically binding fundamental ontology" and eventually thought better of his early pretensions to understand the meaning of being in general in favor of his later doctrine of "ontological historicity." It may, indeed, be the case that Heidegger's ambitions in crafting a fundamental ontology were metaphysical in this sense, though it leaves a good deal to be explained, not least the discussion of historicality in Being and Time itself. Moreover, Thomson lets Heidegger off far too easily here given his robust use of the operative notions (Epoche, Seynsgeschick and Seynsentzug) across epochs. There is also good reason to suppose that the common structural dynamic that Heidegger claims to find, as a matter of historical fact, instantiated in these epochs, including our own, is not only this or that indispensable ontotheology, but more importantly, the ways in which being makes itself present and absent in the course of human dealings with things and with one another.

Reflecting the long-standing dispute about the content of Arisotle's Metaphysics, Scotus begins his commentary on the book with the question: Utrum subiectum metaphysicae sit ens inquantum ens, sicut posuit Avicenna, vel Deus et intelligentiae sicut posuit Commentator Averroes? In other words, Aristotle seemed to many of his readers to leave mixed signals as to whether the subject matter of these studies is beings insofar as they exist (ontology) or the first being (theology) or somehow both. In Chapter 1 Thomson does a nice job of demonstrating how Heidegger's understanding of metaphysics as ontotheology combines these two traditional senses of metaphysics (the study of being as the ontological and theological ground of entities). However, given the tradition of the Aristotelian problem, if it is true in some sense that Heidegger "clarified only slowly" his own understanding of ontotheology (13n. 10), he needed no clarification of the fact that metaphysics had long been beset with these two sorts of questions. In any case, Thomson elaborates how Heidegger deconstructs these double groundings into various epochal constellations of intelligibility, a line of succession that supposedly ceases with Nietzsche who "ironically" both implodes and completes the metaphysical project. Heidegger's thinking after Nietzsche is accordingly an attempt to deconstruct metaphysics historically "in order to call its necessity into question, as a first step to understanding things differently" (23).

Heidegger's critique of technological "enframing" is the subject of caricature, Thomson notes, precisely because of failure to see that it is rooted in Heidegger's assessment of metaphysics and, in particular, the reigning Nietzschean metaphysics as ontotheology. Because Feenberg's objections to Heidegger's particular kind of "technological essentialism" are both informed and paradigmatic of such caricatures and dismissals, Thomson devotes Chapter 2 to critical discussion of those objections. What Feenberg finds objectionable in Heidegger's thinking on technology is its supposed ahistoricism (reified abstraction from concrete social, historical context), substantivism (a fetishistic fatalism), and one-dimensionalism (a monolithic conception). As a prelude to vindicating Heidegger from these objections, Thomson notes Heidegger's insistence on a verbal (non-Platonic) sense of 'essence,' respectively articulated historically by ontotheologies and, in the present, by the increasingly hegemonous and dangerous Nietzschean understanding of being as "an unending disaggregation and reaggregation of forces without any purpose or goal beyond the self-perpetuating augmentation of these forces through their continual self-overcoming" (56). There is obviously a sense, exploited here by Thomson, in which the label of "ahistoricism" simply does not apply to Heidegger, at least not without further ado, given his sensitivity to the historicity of ontotheologies, not least in the contemporary world. (Whether Heidegger is thereby fully vindicated remains problematic; for certain purposes, perhaps those that Feenberg finds warranted, his thinking may not be sufficiently concrete, despite his prescience regarding the deworlding of human subjects.) As for the issue of substantivism, Thomson notes correctly that the sort of ontological transformation Heidegger calls for, far from being a quietist retreat, requires and entails changes on the ontic level and, as Heidegger himself puts it, our free relation to technology, a relation that calls for both essential reflection and "decisive confrontation" with modern technology (Thomson also argues that Feenberg's and Heidegger's approaches are more complementary than Feenberg realizes). Heidegger's technological essentialism is one-dimensional, Thomson concedes, but only in a sense that is, first of all, consistent inasmuch as it recognizes the sort of ontological self-understanding, i.e., the Nietzschean ontotheology, underlying "enframing" and, secondly, innocuous inasmuch as it recognizes the liberating potential of contemporary technology both as itself a kind of clearing and as a source of means of superceding itself, albeit with a greater emphasis on transforming technological intelligibility than technological devices. [A critical aside: In a footnote in Chapter 2 Thomson claims that Heidegger "never abandons the search for the conditions of the possibility of intelligibility" (54 n. 15; also 164n. 24). Yet, at least in the Beiträge, Heidegger thinks otherwise, as he speaks of the need to get away from this approach (see Heidegger, Gesamtausgabe, Bd. 65, p. 250).]

In an attempt to understand both the connection of Heidegger's philosophy to his championing of Hitler's party and the lessons, if any, that he learned from this "political mistake" (as he called it), Thomson turns to Heidegger's vision of the university, early and late. After recovering Heidegger's early understanding of education as Bildung and firm conviction of the importance therein of ontological studies, Thomson aptly characterizes the mix of Nietzschean (via Spengler) and Weberian elements in Heidegger's initial postwar remarks on the task of the university. He contends that this unstable mix eventually tips in Nietzsche's favor, thanks to the influence of Husserl, an influence that Thomson glosses in terms of Husserl's Logos essay "Philosophy as Rigorous Science." Thomson's reconstruction of Heidegger's development in this connection is interesting and informed, although Heidegger's Marburg lectures on Husserl's thought at this juncture (not cited by Thomson) complicate considerably the case he is making. For example, already in a 1923 lecture highly critical of Husserl's Logos essay, Heidegger lampoons much of Husserl's project, notably its scientifically reductive character and neglect of historical existence, animated by what Heidegger dubs an "Angst vor dem Dasein" (cf. Heidegger, Gesamtausgabe, Bd. 17).

The concept of authentic historicality (distinguished here from historicity) is, according to Heidegger himself in 1936, the basis of his political engagement. Without denying this connection between Heidegger's philosophy and politics, Thomson anchors the connection in the concept of fundamental ontology. He contends that the conception motivating the authoritarian claims of the Rektoratsrede is Heidegger's mistaken belief in fundamental ontology. In this connection Thomson lucidly glosses the fact that one of the stated, long-range aims of the project begun in Being and Time is to provide an ontological grounding of positive sciences and historiography in particular. He also rightly emphasizes how pursuit of this aim accords philosophy (or thinking) a "torch-bearing" role opposite the sciences that is a constant in Heidegger's thought. Matters are complicated, however, by the fact that Thomson, while placing so much weight on the project of fundamental ontology, is in the awkward position of not being able to tell us what precisely he takes Heidegger to mean by it in Being and Time, since he claims that it took Heidegger the better part of the following decade to clarify what it is (116). In any case, he contends that by 1937 Heidegger comes to see that "there was no substantive fundamental ontology waiting beneath history to be recovered" (117). Thus, in advancing the authoritarian claims of the Rectorial Address, Heidegger plainly gets ahead of himself, Thomson avers, since he had by no means explained the subordinate relation of positive sciences to fundamental ontology and, indeed, presumably with good reason, since such a conception of fundamental ontology is untenable. Maintaining that Heidegger subsequently abandoned that project, Thomson infers that he learned from this mistake, as pursuit of "fundamental ontology" gives way to historical analysis of the ways in which "ontotheologies … mediate between a basic ontological 'presencing' and the guiding ontological presuppositions of the positive sciences" (118).

Though there is something to be said for these claims, it can be misleading (not only for reasons already mentioned but also due to the differences between Heidegger's fundamental ontology and the sorts of ontology -- formal and regional -- countenanced by Husserl) to regard Being and Time as Heidegger's way of fulfilling "Husserl's grand ambition of 'the systematic fundamental science of philosophy'" (108). Heidegger's use of "fundamental ontology" in Being and Time is admittedly slippery but the relevant disanalogy with the Husserlian project seems apparent from the fact that Heidegger often uses the expression to designate the interpretation of Dasein's being, something that is, he advises repeatedly, serviceable but incomplete, provisional, and merely preparatory for tackling the question of the meaning of being at all (SZ 233, 316, 333, 366; §83). Moreover, the primordial historicality of Dasein affirmed in Being and Time seems plainly at odds with the pretensions of transhistoricality that Thomson attributes to fundamental ontology (116-122). Of course, this discrepancy may simply indicate deep incoherencies and confusions besetting the project announced in Being and Time. Yet, even if one were to accept this less generous interpretation, a great deal more needs to be considered to make the case that Heidegger in the ensuing years clung to that ill-fated project (as Thomson reconstructs it) up to the time of the Rectorial Address.

Nevertheless, the way in which Thomson connects Heidegger's conception of philosophy as an ontological study underlying the sciences with his idea of the university is illuminating and important. His general claim that the philosophical mistake motivating -- at least in good measure -- the pretensions of reforming the university and providing intellectual guidance to National Socialism stems from the very project of Being and Time is, in my view, highly credible. Thomson owes us, I have been suggesting, a more adequate account of the sense of fundamental ontology in Being and Time and of its hold on Heidegger's thinking (especially after 1929). However, I think that a version of his claim could be made not only more precise but even more compelling with the qualifications such an account would provide. It would also reinforce his contention that the later Heidegger would have refined but retained the basic structure of the Rectorial Address and that he mistakenly follows Nietzsche's strategy of combating fragmentation by rejecting academic freedom. Thomson concludes the third chapter by trenchantly debunking the view, variously championed by Pöggeler and Derrida, that the lesson Heidegger learned from this period is the inherent impossibility of the sort of university reform he envisions.

This conclusion nicely sets the stage for the concluding chapter, a vigorous elaboration of the promise of "Heidegger's Mature Vision of Ontological Education." After demonstrating why Heidegger sees education in general as something grounded in the history of being and considers education today to be a decentered enframing, grounded in a Nietzschean ontotheology, Thomson reconstructs Heidegger's counterproposal, a retrieval of the essence of Platonic paideia as an ontological education, "leading us to the place of our essential being" (151-159), patterned on the four steps suggested by Plato's allegory of the cave. Thomson expands insightfully on the awakening of a "fundamental comportment" involved here, more a "hearkening" than a "resoluteness" or "releasement" (a consideration of die Grundstimmung der Verhaltenheit might be helpful here; see p. 161 n. 21), on the senses of negative and positive ontological freedom entailed by this vision of education, and not least on Heidegger's conception of teaching as (in contrast to instruction) a matter of learning, specifically, learning to let students learn. In the book's final section (appropriately entitled "Envisioning a community of learners") Thomson attempts to explain the prospects of realizing ontological education, as Heidegger conceives it, without repeating the errors of the 1930s. Thomson reasons that, given Heidegger's abandonment of fundamental ontology and the inadmissibility of his Frontgemeinschaft model for the university, the main challenge is securing the unity of the university. The key, he suggests, lies in the supposed way that "Heidegger's mature reontologization of education" would combine ideals advocated by Fichte and Humboldt: "That is, the university community would be unified both by its shared commitment to forming excellent individuals (where excellence is understood in terms of the ontological perfectionism outlined earlier) and by the shared recognition on the part of this community that its members are committed to the same important pursuit … not simply of understanding what is, but of recognizing, contesting, and seeking to transcend the underlying ontotheology that generates the ontological presuppositions implicitly guiding the various fields of knowledge" (177).