Heidegger on Technology

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Aaron James Wendland, Chistopher Merwin, and Christos Hadjioannou (eds.), Heidegger on TechnologyRoutledge, 2019, 345pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138674615.

Reviewed by David R. Cerbone, West Virginia University


This volume comprises seventeen original papers by sixteen contributors (Aaron James Wendland, contributed two). As is to be expected, Heidegger's seminal essay, "The Question Concerning Technology" (hereafter QCT),[1] first published in 1954, serves as a touchstone for the volume, with many contributors dutifully rehearsing often overlapping interpretations of the constellation of key concepts Heidegger deploys there and in neighboring writings: Bestand (rendered as "standing-reserve" in William Lovitt's translation, but perhaps more perspicuously translated as simply "resource" or, as Mark A. Wrathall renders it, "stock" in the sense of the goods on hand); Gestell (for which Lovitt provides "enframing," but which could be rendered as "framework," or, as Wrathall suggests, "inventory," thereby complementing his rendering of Bestand as "stock," or even "im-position," as Daniel O. Dahlstrom offers); and what serves as an antidote of sorts to these two master concepts, Gelassenheit (often translated as "releasement," and connected with the idea of "letting be"). Also at issue in many essays is how to understand the "supreme danger" posed by technology, as well as the role thinking plays in addressing and alleviating that danger.

The essays by Wrathall, Tobias Keiling, Bret W. Davis, Iain Thomson, and Susanne Claxton  stay squarely focused on these key concepts. But many of the others strike out in different directions from this zero-point of Heidegger's reflections on technology. Several contributions situate these reflections in relation to Heidegger's philosophy more generally, including his masterwork, Being and Time, written decades earlier. Christos Hadjioannou finds intimations of Heidegger's later critique of technology in his much earlier critique of Husserl's method of phenomenological reduction. Steven Crowell, in distinguishing phenomenological and historical strands of Heidegger's thoughts about technology, thereby reaches back to Heidegger's earlier and more self-consciously phenomenological work. Crowell reads Heidegger as committed to a broadly phenomenological method throughout his works and argues that an emphasis on this commitment allows for a kind of internal criticism of his more speculative historical theses. And Denis McManus, in his fascinating analysis of the "audit society" as exemplifying what Heidegger considered to be the dangers of Machenschaft (or "machination"), draws upon themes already present in Being and Time. Other essays situate Heidegger's later thoughts on technology in relation to other chapters in his philosophical development: Dahlstrom reads QCT in relation to Heidegger's essay, "On the Essence of Truth," first published in 1943 (and based upon a lecture from 1930), but which Heidegger returned to at intervals corresponding to formative moments in his thinking on technology, such as the Bremen lectures, that laid the ground for QCT and several other seminal essays from Heidegger's later period.[2] Andrew J. Mitchell provides a close examination of Heidegger's technology notebooks from the 1940s into the 1950s. While Heidegger famously cautions in QCT that the essence of technology "is by no means anything technological,"[3] the notebooks reveal just how fine-grained Heidegger's attention was to the specifics of machine technology. In his first contribution, Wendland situates Heidegger's thoughts on technology in relation to his notorious engagement with National Socialism, arguing that his "enthusiasm" for the movement stemmed at least in part from "his belief that the Nazis represented a radical break from the Western tradition that begins with Greek metaphysics." (p. 149)

Other essays consider Heidegger's reflections on technology in relation to other philosophers: Wendland's first essay includes a consideration of Levinas, while his second examines Heidegger's claim that "science does not think" in relation to Thomas Kuhn's contrast between "normal" and "revolutionary" science, understood as the contrast between working within a given a paradigm and a paradigm shift. Julian Young considers the interplay between Heidegger and Habermas. While both are concerned with the dangers posed by technology, Young notes how their respective notions of a "free relation to technology" operate at different levels, so to speak. At issue for Habermas "is simply a relation between man and 'machine' in which the latter serves the former rather than vice versa." (p. 204) Young thus concludes that for Habermas, "all that is required to obviate the danger to human freedom posed by (system) technology is to ensure that it really does serve human interests." (p. 204) While it might appear that Heidegger's critique of the Frankfurt School approach to technology is a failure, Young locates a deeper concern in Heidegger with the threat of nihilism that Habermas' cosmopolitanism obscures: the "homelessness" of modernity can only be overcome by a kind of "dwelling" that recognizes the need for "homeland." Young notes the rise in contemporary politics of parties and movements that reject globalization in favor of more populist and provincial ideas. Although there is a tendency to dismiss such movements as right wing, neo-fascist, nativist, and the like (and sometimes rightly so), He suggests at the close of his paper that we should be sensitive to the underlying motivations for such otherwise dangerous and distressing views. As illustrating a need for homeland, the appearance of such movements mark an "occasion for, not scorn, but rather thought." (p. 207)

Several essays put Heidegger in conversation with other strands of 20th and 21st Century thinking. Michael E. Zimmerman considers Heidegger in relation to the "deep ecology" movement associated with Arne Naess and others, while Trish Glazebrook takes an "ecofeminist" approach that draws upon contemporary debates about sustainability. Taylor Carman considers Heidegger's views on technology in relation to quantum mechanics, detailing his engagement with Werner Heisenberg, whose lecture, "The Image of Nature in Modern Physics," was delivered at the Munich conference where Heidegger presented QCT. The final essay, by Rafael Winkler, brings together Heidegger and André Leroi-Gourhan, whose thoughts on "hominization" (the emergence of the human in natural history) and "graphism" (the ability and practice of making inscriptions) broach the possibility of "naturalizing" Heidegger's thinking.

The number and range of the contributions prevent detailed discussion of the many important and insightful ideas each of them raises. I want instead to highlight what I take to be some of the core themes informing many of the essays. In doing so, I also want to point to what strike me as tensions in Heidegger's critique of technology between what seems to be the "big picture" of Heidegger's view and many of the specific points the contributors frequently emphasize. These tensions also suggest serious limitations in terms of the ethical, political, and practical applicability of Heidegger's thinking on this front.

I want to focus primarily on a kind of "master thesis" that Wrathall offers, which begins, and thereby serves to frame, the volume as a whole. Central to the later Heidegger is a kind of historicist account of the understanding of being. [4] Wrathall refers to this as Heidegger's "universal and total grounds thesis" or UTGT, which he glosses as follows:

Within each historical (metaphysical) age, there is a particular understanding of being in terms of which entities show up and make sense. This understanding of being is universal, meaning it determines every entity as such. It is also total, meaning it also governs every way that entities can relate to and interact with each other. (p. 16)

In accordance with this thesis, the technological understanding of being is one such "universal and total" ground that determines entities in its own particular way: everything shows up and makes sense as what Heidegger calls Bestand (resources or stock) that can be ordered (and re-ordered) in ways that maximize efficiency and, as Wrathall puts it, keep our "options" open. This is the way things are primarily understood in the modern age, according to Heidegger.

The difficulty that concerns me has to do with squaring this kind of master thesis -- Heidegger's historicism -- with the kind of critical leverage many commentators read him as providing when it comes to the ways the technological understanding of being distorts or effaces what various kinds of entities really are. The question, in other words, is what that last phrase -- really are -- means when considered in conjunction with Heidegger's historicism. Consider what Wrathall says in the midst of a long footnote: "Each entity can show itself as what it 'really and actually' is only within the world (or perhaps set of worlds) that allows it to be." (p. 37) It is not clear to me whether the phrase, "really and actually," is in scare-quotes here to steer us away from reading it in an overly straightforward way.

Leaving that worry aside, the more serious one is that Wrathall's formulation risks emptiness or, barring that, begs the question. Regarding emptiness, his formulation can be read more fully as saying that "each entity can show itself as what it 'really and actually' is only within the world (or perhaps set of worlds) that allows it to be what it 'really and actually' is." That seems unobjectionable, I suppose, but it also strikes me as fairly vacuous. What would save it from vacuity is providing a way of determining just which world (or set of worlds) that is in the case of various entities or kinds of entities. And here is where the question is begged, as a proponent of scientific realism, for example, will want to know why some other world (or set of worlds) offers more in the way of "allowance" than the natural sciences in terms of revealing what the entity really is. But even without resorting to scientific realism, which after all is a critical perspective external to Heidegger's own, it is not clear how to square such a claim to "really and actually" with the point of view that Heidegger himself seems to offer, at least according to several essays in this volume.

In both of his contributions, Wendland rehearses the broad contours of Heidegger's conception of the being of entities, whereby "the being of an entity is determined by a set of theoretical assumptions and practical norms that undergird a particular goal-directed activity." (p. 289) Using the example of silver in the second (gold is the focal example in the first essay), Wendland notes the way what silver is has varied according to different understandings of being: for example, as a "sacred entity" according to a "given religious tradition," as "financial entity" within "certain economic system," and as "a physical entity with an atomic mass of 107.87" within "a specific physical theory." (p. 289) If we accept, as I'm inclined to think that we should, that Wendland is on strong interpretive ground here, then what becomes of his assertions about what an entity "really and actually" is? Take a lump -- or even a molded piece -- of silver: if its being -- what it is and that it is -- varies according to different "theoretical assumptions and practical norms" that correspond to different human-historical worlds, which one of those worlds "allows" the silver to be what it "really and actually" is? Each world "allows" it to be something different -- something sacred, something with exchange value, something with very specific physical properties, to use Wendland's three examples (but there could presumably be more) -- but which one of those is the silver's own? Which way for silver to be belongs to the silver such that we can say about that way -- and that world (or set of worlds) -- that silver is there allowed to be what it "really and actually" is?

Wendland, for his part, singles out the technological mode of revealing -- Gestell (enframing) -- as reductive insofar as the techno-scientific understanding of being precludes "an openness to non-reductive ways of relating to entities." (p. 289) While there is something perhaps cold about the scientific perspective when it comes to silver and the like, as it is analyzed and categorized in ways amenable to quantitative treatment, the charge of being reductive presupposes that what is being omitted, i.e., what is characterized here as "non-reductive," in some way more genuinely belongs to what silver is.

I have already suggested that this claim is apt to appear question-begging. But further attention to the contours of Heidegger's views reveals a deeper problem here. As Wendland himself acknowledges, for Heidegger every cultural-historical understanding of being -- every normatively charged practical-theoretical way in which things are understood to be -- is both revealing and concealing. Every understanding leaves something obscured, such that it cannot be brought to presence from "within" that understanding. As Wendland notes, being has both "light" and "dark" sides, such that any given paradigm both reveals and conceals or obscures: "A physicist, for example, may know that silver has an atomic mass of 107.87, but at the same time she may be unaware of the metal's economic value or religious significance." (p. 285) Notice, though, that this is as true for the "given religious tradition" wherein silver is something sacred and the "economic system" wherein silver has a determinate exchange value. Each of those obscure something brought to presence by and in the other, but both in turn obscure what is revealed from the techno-scientific perspective. The question thus arises as to how it is that only the techno-scientific understanding is singled out as "reductive." Is it not any less reductive to say that what the silver is is something with a determinative exchange value or that what it is is something sacred? Thus when Wendland complains that "in modernity . . . we treat silver as a physical entity with an atomic mass of 107.87 and we dismiss religious, economic, and various other interpretations of it as irrelevant to our exercise of power," it is not clear why the charge does not apply equally to any of those other interpretations when that interpretation is the one that holds sway. (For example, the ways in which the sciences have been dismissed -- and scientists persecuted -- on religious grounds are nowhere considered.)

While I have singled out Wrathall and Wendland for expository purposes, other contributors are equally generous in helping themselves to notions that seem hard to square with Heidegger's fundamental historicism. We learn from various other contributors that Heidegger is concerned with the possibility of allowing "things to reveal themselves in accordance with their own possibilities" (Zimmerman, p. 214); that "other living beings appear in strong sustainability in terms of their unique, relational role in the ecosystem, i.e., as what they are rather than being reduced to resource" (Glazebrook, p. 250); that enframing "denies the possibility of intrinsic value, acknowledging only extrinsic value" (Claxton, p. 227); that "Heidegger thinks we need . . . to learn to attend to and creatively disclose the defining traits and unique capacities of all things, ourselves included," so as "to begin bringing genuine meaning back into our historical world. (Thomson, p. 181); and that "any thought of an ultimate (ontological) context for understanding is always a distorting imposition on the genuine meaning of entities" (Keiling, p. 106). The question throughout concerns what these italicized phrases come to. What, for Heidegger, is "intrinsic value"? What are something's "own possibilities" as opposed to possibilities that are imposed? How are we to differentiate between "genuine" meaning and any second-rate, ersatz variety?

The problem here is that on Heidegger's view we are supposed to see the technological understanding of being as just one more way of understanding among others (one in a pageant of understandings of being starting with the Greeks) and that there is something distinctively distorting or dangerous about it in contrast to those prior to it. Since every understanding of being is both revealing and concealing, seeing the dangers of the technological understanding of being as bound up with technology's special power to distort or obscure what various entities "really and actually" are strikes me as difficult to sustain. And indeed, when Heidegger discusses what he takes to be the "supreme danger" of the technological understanding of being, it has little to do with these kinds of claims to distortion. What becomes especially obscured in the techno-scientific age is the distinctively human capacity for opening or constituting new historical-cultural worlds. This is so because of the all-encompassing character of the technological understanding of being's "enframing" of things as "resources." We, too, on this model are just more resources to be optimized, placed in the overarching inventory of everything on hand. While prior understandings of being have offered up their own conceptions of what it is to be human -- such as being created in the image of God, in the Medieval Christian understanding -- these have demonstrably allowed for the "sending" of new understandings. Heidegger's worry when it comes to the technological understanding is that what prior understandings of being have allowed will be effectively and finally foreclosed: "The rule of enframing threatens man with the possibility that it could be denied to him to enter into a more original revealing and hence to experience the call of a more primal truth."[5]

When Heidegger talks here about "a more original revealing" and "a more primal truth," his concern is not with what entities "really and actually are" but instead something more like an overcoming of the whole way of thinking that seeks to determine what entities really and actually are. Herein lies the importance of Gelassenheit as a releasement not just from the technological understanding of being, but from anything corresponding to Wrathall's UTGT. I take this to be what Wrathall means when he says that Heidegger's thinking involves "preparation for a whole new way of disclosing things -- one that is not subject to a universal and totalizing metaphysical ground." (p. 21)

To put it in Thomson's terms, the problem is not so much technology as it is ontotheology in general (hence Thomson's reading of Heidegger as promoting a kind of "ontological pluralism"). Keiling also recognizes Heidegger's aim as a movement away from any all-encompassing understanding of what is: "To relate to entities in thinking in such a way as to enable them is to accept and foster that plurality. If there is no final horizon, then this will include the different ways in which we can understand all there is." (p. 112) Heidegger's aim is thus to foster "a thinking that embraces the openness of ontological thinking." (p. 112) (Whether this thinking is still to be understood as ontological is itself at issue in Heidegger's Country Path Conversations,[6] another frequent touchstone of this collection.) And as Wendland points out, it is "the history of metaphysics from Plato to Nietzsche [that] treats the being of entities as 'imperishable and eternal' and thereby 'drives out every other possibility of revealing'." (p. 159)

Notice, however, that if Heidegger's real concern with technology -- with the essence of technology -- lies here, then many of the familiar issues and anxieties associated with technology, including many rehearsed in this volume, are only tangentially related to Heidegger's critique. I cited -- and raised questions about -- Wendland's charge that by treating silver "as a physical entity with an atomic mass of 107.87," we are thereby dismissive of "other interpretations." Wendland continues by noting that "this dismissal is dangerous because it leads to the environmental degradation and human dislocation that typifies our age, and it simultaneously robs us of the possibility of interacting with nature in an alternative and sustainable way." (p. 296) While it may be -- and indeed very likely is -- true that our modern techno-scientific ways of engaging with the world have caused -- and continue to cause -- alarming and potentially catastrophic environmental degradation, from a Heideggerian perspective, that is only a kind of collateral damage at best (i.e., Wendland's "because" is not Heidegger's).

We might see this by entertaining the following counterfactual: suppose there were nothing environmentally harmful about an increase in carbon dioxide and that other known pollutants were similarly non-injurious to various ecosystems (they simply dissolved or disappeared). While I admit that this supposition borders on a kind of magical thinking, notice that it would leave in place Heidegger's concerns about the "supreme danger" of the technological understanding of being. While there may be affinities between Gelassenheit, understood as a way of "letting beings be," and ecologically-informed notions of sustainability (as, for example, Glazebrook argues in her piece), the connections do not strike me as being as direct as some of the essays want to suggest. There also remains the frustratingly passive and quietistic dimensions of Heidegger's later thinking about technology with its talk of "awaiting" and "preparing" for new "sendings." It is not clear how helpful such notions are if we are indeed on the brink of an environmental catastrophe. And his remarks about fostering a "free relation to technology" are remarkably thin, consisting of little more than the recommendation that "we let technical devices enter into our daily life, and at the same time leave them outside."[7] While there may be something commendable about such a stance, it still allows for the relentless innovation and production of ever more such devices and all that comes along with it. The problem here, as elsewhere in Heidegger's philosophy, is the studied cultivation of a kind of aloofness in his thinking, a preference for the heights of ontology as opposed to the messiness of what is merely ontical. In his first essay, Wendland recommends Levinas as a supplement to address "Heidegger's obliviousness to the concrete sufferings of individual human beings." (p. 168) My worry is that this "obliviousness" reaches much farther than even Wendland acknowledges and requires more than supplementation to correct. (On this score, I don't think Levinas understood himself to be supplementing Heidegger's ontology as much as subverting it in a far more radical way.)[8]

I close with what struck me while working through the volume as an unremarked irony of the kind of ontological pluralism Heidegger offers to counter the perils of technology in particular and ontotheology more generally. At several junctures in this volume, the limiting and reductive understanding of being that constitutes the essence of technology (and, really, any UTGT-type understanding) is contrasted with the "inexhaustible" character of being or nature, whereby being's limitless "excess" overflows the limited and constraining character of any particular understanding of being. The irony here lies in being's depiction as the most wondrous resource of all, whose offerings can be continually mined without fear of depletion. Perhaps it illustrates the tenacity of the technological understanding of being that Heidegger himself was in its thrall even while struggling to think from a perspective outside of it. Ironies aside, this volume is a valuable resource that I highly recommend for those wanting to learn more about, and engage critically with, Heidegger's philosophy of technology.


Thanks to Iain Thomson for comments and criticisms of a draft of this review.

[1] The English translation can be found in The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays, translated by W. Lovitt (New York: Harper and Row, 1977). All citations will be to this edition.

[2] See Heidegger, Bremen and Freiburg Lectures, translated by Andrew J. Mitchell (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2012).

[3] QCT, p. 4.

[4] See Fredrik Westerlund's forthcoming Heidegger and the Problem of Phenomena (London: Bloomsbury, 2020) for a careful examination of the tensions in Heidegger's thought generated by his commitments to both phenomenology and a broadly historicist thesis regarding the understanding of being.

[5] QCT, p. 28.

[6] See Country Path Conversations, translated by Bret W. Davis (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2016), especially p. 90, where the Scholar states that "in the relation between open-region and releasement, if it is still a relation at all, can be thought of neither as ontic nor as ontological." (p. 90)

[7] Martin Heidegger, Discourse on Thinking, translated by J. M. Anderson and E. H. Freund (New York: Harper and Row, 1966), p. 54. Note that the original title of this work is Gelassenheit.

[8] See, for example, his "Is Ontology Fundamental?" in Basic Philosophical Writings, edited by A. Peperzak, S. Critchley, and R. Bernasconi (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1996).