Heidegger: Phenomenology, Ecology, Politics

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Michael Marder, Heidegger: Phenomenology, Ecology, Politics, University of Minnesota Press, 2018, 195pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781517905033.

Reviewed by Wayne Froman, George Mason University


Michael Marder's book is particularly thought-provoking. It comprises an Introduction and three Parts, each including three chapters.

The first chapter of Part I ("Phenomenology") is "'Higher Than Actuality': The Possibility of Phenomenology." The reference is to Heidegger's phenomenological observation in Being and Time that possibility stands higher than actuality. Possibility here pertains to (1) Dasein (the type of entity that we are in that we ex-ist), given that possibilities are an intrinsic feature of Dasein's "being-in-the-world;" (2) phenomenology, where the specific reference is to Heidegger's opening of phenomenology as developed by Husserl to what Heidegger calls fundamental ontology; and (3) to the Destruktion of the tradition, in that it aims at making possible another beginning for thought.

The second chapter, "Failure and Nonactualizable Possibility," develops a particularly interesting correlation between the role of possibility in our being-in-the-world and a sense of failure as it pertains to our ex-istence. By virtue of the temporal character of our ex-istence (temporality is the meaning of Dasein), and the ec-static character of time (time is the ekstatikon par excellence), I am never simply who I am. When finitude, as understood by Heidegger, is taken into account, the result is a sense of non-actualizable possibility belonging to our existential or ontological structure. Marder identifies a "fecundity of failure" whereby existential failure brings about different possibilities. He relates his description to the silent call of conscience as Heidegger describes it in Being and Time, and via Heidegger's understanding, in that text, of what takes place when equipment fails, to the character of "technicity" on an historical scale.

Marder associates failure here with Heidegger's sense of "fallenness" (Verfallenheit) in Being and Time. Given that the factor of height has already been introduced by virtue of how possibility lies higher than actuality, and given Heidegger's explicit specification to the effect that fallenness, as he intends it, is not to be understood in terms of a fall from a height where I previously found myself, this association may not be entirely felicitous. In any event, one wonders why Marder did not invoke Heidegger's sense of "errancy" (Irrnis) (as Peter Trawny does in Freedom to Fail: Heidegger's Anarchy,[1] although errancy, while providing a sense of straying rather than falling, does not provide any immediate sense of fecundity. Perhaps one would have to reach for Hölderlin's point that where the danger grows, the saving power grows as well.

The third chapter, "The Phenomenology of Ontico-Ontological Difference," compares Husserl's phenomenology with Hegel's, both as understood by Heidegger. The comparison leads to Heidegger's own phenomenological ontology. Whereas Hegel prioritizes the ontological, while understanding it metaphysically (and, ultimately, Heidegger understands Hegel's thought as culminating in metaphysics), Husserl never reaches the question of being [das Sein], but rather remains captive to the ontic. (Actually, Heidegger did find that Husserl glimpsed the issue when discussing perception in the sixth of the Logical Investigations.) Heidegger will think "the between," that is, the "ontico-ontological difference," and thereby, a non-metaphysical sense of being.

When describing Heidegger's retrieval of the being question via Husserl's phenomenology, Marder writes:

On the heels of phenomenological reduction, the being of consciousness is intentionality, the directedness of consciousness toward something, its being, in each case, of something. Intentional consciousness is relative knowledge (and relative being) par excellence. Inherently relational, it is circumscribed by that of which it is conscious and rests on the intended, despite having been insulated from adumbrated reality as such. In this respect, it diverges from absolute knowledge that is no longer or not yet of something: "Is not knowledge as such a knowledge of something? This is precisely what Hegel denies and must deny when he claims that there is a knowledge which is qualitatively not relative but absolute".[2] Prior to its fulfillment in intuition where noetic acts and their noematic targets join each other in quasi-tautological correlations, intentionality (i.e., the being of consciousness, or, simply being) is essentially a relatum. (p. 53)

When describing Heidegger's retrieval of the being question via Hegel's phenomenology, Marder writes:

Heidegger proposes an interpretation of "experience as denoting, both negatively and positively, undergoing an experience with something."[3] The "with" of experience is propitious to the subtle inflections of existentiality: the being with, Mitdasein, of consciousness comes to refer to the facticity of its unfolding alongside its objects, to its reflexive return to itself as self-consciousness, and to its being in absolute proximity (Παρουϱια) to the absolute. The small preposition "with" assembles the positive and the negative, the ontic and the ontological, the existential and the categorial, for ontico-ontological difference to take its nonplace. The first of the three meanings of "experience with" is the only one that makes sense in the phenomenology of relative consciousness [such as Husserl's], The rich existentiality of the "with" wears off in the judged appropriateness and the co-belonging of the experiencing and the experienced. (p. 60)

Added distinctions would be helpful. When Heidegger shows how the concern with being figures in the thought of a major thinker in the tradition, this is not identical to Heidegger's own "thinking of being" because the thinking within the tradition remains metaphysical. Where Husserl and Hegel are concerned, a mark of metaphysics is subjectivism. An analogy would be that when Heidegger identifies the transcendental unity of apperception in Kant's thought as being, it is being as regarded metaphysically. Such distinctions could be helpful for sorting out such locutions as "intentionality of consciousness as being," or "Mitdasein (being-Dasein-with) of consciousness, which are, standing on their own, rather jarring, given that "intentionality" and "consciousness," let alone "Mitdasein of consciousness," are not to be found when it comes to Heidegger's own vocabulary.

This recalls the Introduction. Marder indirectly calls attention there to the specific difficulty to which I refer when he writes:

We should not . . . conflate phenomenological possibility with yet another incarnation of a crypto-Kantian transcendentalism, stressing the abstract and ideal conditions of possibility for experience. The argument latent in much of Heidegger's corpus is that the conditioning is itself conditioned by the vicissitudes of political and ecological existence, by the historical shape being-with-the-other (Mitsein, Mitdasein [and to be precise, neither of which mentions "other"]) assumes, and by the ecological milieu within which experiences unfold. (p. iv)

The topic of the three Parts are, respectively:  phenomenological possibility, political existence and ecological existence. They constitute a triangle that Marder refers to as Heidegger's eternal triangle (Marder says the triangle returns eternally). The triangle unifies the book's three Parts. This triangle does not figure in Heidegger's thought, where "eternal return" only appears in reference to Nietzsche. Combining nine essays, written independently over a decade, into a single, unified volume is not a simple matter. The result here is not totally seamless.

Part II ("Ecology") begins with "To Open a Site: A Political Phenomenology of Dwelling." Marder writes:

Lest it appear to be totalizing, the polis is an incomplete, unfinished dwelling, uniting the negative and positive aspects of incompletion (and, by implication, of existential failure). First, positively and continually failing, its circle cannot be closed off, in that the questioning it provokes lacks a final answer. It must remain worthy of question for the Greeks -- that is its enabling openness and a feature that makes being at home itself unhomely, uncanny, uninhabitable. (p. 71)

Marder describes the place or site for our dwelling as displaying both a vertical and a horizontal dimension. The vertical dimension, lying between earth and sky, pertains to the political, while the horizontal dimension pertains to ethos, the way in which being-with (Mitsein) takes shape in a specific dwelling site. Marder writes:

Dwelling, or being a Dasein, is standing in the "zero-point" where the vertical political and the horizontal ethical axes intersect. (p. 75)

And further:

Dwelling "between earth and sky" is being suspended between ontological or ecological ethics and politics. (p. 75)

It is not by chance that the respective Spanish and Portuguese translations of Dasein are ser-ahi and ser-ai, "being here-there." As such, they reveal the ethical ground of fundamental ontology and the axiom that Dasein is, in and of itself, a Mitsein, being-with, in the gap between here and there. (p. 76)

At this juncture, we would be well advised to consider what Heidegger says. First, ecology makes an appearance by virtue of its derivation from the Greek oikos for house, and hence a relation to dwelling, plus the Greek logos, in the sense of gathering that at the same time holds apart (as discussed by Heidegger in his essay on logos in Heraclitus), and hence a relation to "the between." Now, what Heidegger does in Being and Time is fundamental ontology, but he does not identify an ethical ground for this. Are we to think that Heidegger's determination to the effect that Mitsein is equiprimordial (gleichϋrsprunglich) with Dasein means, ipso facto, that the ground of fundamental ontology is ethical? Heidegger also specifies that mortality, the possibility of no further possibilities, one's ownmost possibility, radically individualizes Dasein. Moreover, he also specifies that Dasein is "in each case, mine." Is the possibility of identifying ethics as the ground of fundamental ontology a possibility newly conjured by Marder, or is it a possibility latent in Heidegger's thought? It would appear such matters have to be sorted out at this juncture in order to adopt this as a possibility at all. Absent that, we could be left dealing with a type of kaleidoscope of possibilities, one where it becomes particularly difficult to take any bearings, which would leave us, ultimately, in circumstances that Heidegger, in fact, decries.

The rest of the chapter and the following one ("Devastation") address those circumstances and their worsening. Marder writes:

In contrast to political and ethical ecology, modernity has inaugurated a political and ethical economy. . . . I use this phrase with reference to the widespread machination, accounting, calculation and quantitative valuation that are our default attitudes outside the economic scope. (p. 78)

He is careful to note that within the "economic scope" there is a place for economics, but when what belongs to economics becomes "our default attitudes outside the economic scope," "Western metaphysics [reaches] its culmination in nihilism" (p. 78). Here is a description from Marder:

That is what the betweenness of human dwelling, the interval between earth and sky has been reduced to -- a cost-benefit analysis and, ultimately, arithmetic differences. (p. 81)

In "The Secret Sources of Political Economy," Marder, following Heidegger's lead of finding nothing but decline in the translation of the Greek, in this case, polis, into Latin, in this case, imperium, writes: "Whatever its political realities, imperium is always economic" (p. 92), from oikos, house, and nomos, law, in this case, the Roman empire's legal system.

In "The Need for Housing and the Desire for Dwelling," Marder presents a point that is, in this reviewer's estimation, quite crucial and all too often overlooked when the topic is "ecology." The passage bears citing in full:

Contemporary economicist ecology is, understandably reactive, given the severity of the environmental crisis. In addition, the ontological explanation for the reaction governing our conception of ecology is that need overrides all other considerations, first and foremost those of desire. What would politics, ethics and ecology be like if they did not have to put out fires (set alight by the widespread and indifferent economization of the world) with materials procured from the very incendiary rationality that has degraded our planetary dwelling to its present condition (of a house on fire)? How would the desire for dwelling, surpassing any need that typically presumes the non-negotiable exigencies of survival, shape and be shaped by that other ecology? (p. 94)

 Marder then draws on Heidegger's thinking in regard to the "thingly" character of things to make the point that "There can be only an ecology of things, for an economy is more fitting to a commerce with objects; where there are no things, there is no hope for ecology" (p. 111). "Objects" are correlative to subjects, thus metaphysical in the traditional sense, and not suitable for dwelling.

In "Devastation" [die Verwϋstung, from die Wϋste, the desert], Marder describes devastation, as understood by Heidegger, as: "the pressing advance of the desert -- vast, unoccupied, desolate, vacant, vacated of beings. . . . Being, 'as such and as a whole,' is en route to becoming a wasteland" (p. 140). Marder concludes that: "The challenge is to let in (and to be let into) the letting suspended between abandonment [by being] and releasement, Verlassenheit and Gelassenheit. Perhaps only this in-between within devastation can still save us" (p. 144). Heidegger had counseled attentiveness for the (re)turning (die Kehre) of being, which would allow a leap to another beginning of thought, and finally, preparation to be prepared for the appearance of a divinity, lest all goes downhill all the way.

In "An Ecology of Property" Marder makes the case, against the background of the historical moment of privatization of property in Russia, that the ecologico-phenomenological understanding of property is prior to the economic-political context. He does so with help from the work of philosopher Vladimir Bibikhin (Heidegger's Russian translator). This affords an added glimpse into the reception of Heidegger's thought in Russia.

The first chapter, "The Question of Political Existence," of Part III "(Politics") is an analysis of Heidegger's 1934-35 seminar on Hegel's Philosophy of Right. Heidegger compares Hegel's thought with Karl Schmitt's in a manner analogous to Marder's comparison between Husserl's thought and Heidegger's in the third chapter. Hegel overemphasizes the ontological (in a metaphysical sense), while Schmitt's thought is confined to the ontic. Marder finds that Heidegger oversimplifies Hegel (although Marder adds that Heidegger had to be aware of this), and gives short shrift to Schmitt, whose "nonmetaphysical political ontology is [on Marder's assessment] as attuned to existential realities and possibilities as that of Heidegger himself" (p. 140). Regarding Heidegger, Marder observes that studying the 1934-35 seminars brings to light "everything promising" and "everything that is pernicious, if not downright appalling" (particularly, Heidegger's appeal to the "'the leader' [der Fϋhrer]) principle") in what Heidegger thought then concerning political existence. In the end, Marder observes that "we are yet to gauge the depth of the ontico-ontological difference and other aspects of Dasein-analysis in the question of political existence" (p. 144).

In the next chapter, "The Other 'Jewish Question," Marder compares, with respect to negative comments regarding Jewry, Marx's 1843 essay "On the Jewish Question" and Heidegger's Black Notebooks plus a 1933-34 seminar, "On the Essence and Concepts of Nature, History, and State."[4] Marder does not mince words regarding Heidegger:

Despite the intellectual contortions evident in everything Heidegger has to say about the Jews, it is glaringly obvious that, having temporarily deafened himself to the call of thinking (and of being), he indulges in stereotyping, as he imputes mutually contradictory traits to the same stereo-typical subject: the subhuman and the superhuman; an animal and a calculating machine, a racializing and a deracializing agent . . . (p. 154)

Basically, what Marder finds superior in Marx's comments regarding Jews compared to Heidegger's is Marx's awareness of distinctions where different communities of Jews were concerned.

Marder finds the worst thing Heidegger said about the Jews is that they lacked a world, and consequently could not dwell humanly in, for example, German space, as did Germans. He also finds that if Heidegger had remained consistent on this matter with the priority of possibility in his own thinking generally, he could have realized that (given the importance of tradition in the lives of Jews rather than ground spatially) Jews ground temporally (giving priority to what is more important in Being and Time). But Heidegger had absorbed anti-semitism from his milieu from early on to the point of basically taking it for granted.

Whatever one may think regarding any possible relations between Heidegger's commentary regarding Jewry and his thought overall, the premise of Marder's gesture here is questionable. The major Jewish philosophical thinker and contemporary of Heidegger was Franz Rosenzweig (who anticipated, in The Star of Redemption, Heidegger's later shift to an equiprimordiality of space and time, as well as the event [das Ereignis] at their origin). When comparing Christianity and Judaism, Rosenzweig concluded that while Christians ground in time, Jews (notwithstanding the role of tradition), actually ground in space (and this was before becoming somewhat positive regarding Zionism).[5]

The last chapter, "Philosophy without Right? On Heidegger's Notes for the 1934-35 'Hegel Seminar,'" was co-authored with Marcia Sá Cavalcante-Schuback. It provides further insight into Heidegger's reading of Hegel, particularly regarding the relation between the political context and philosophical thought.

The book refers to pertinent and significant texts from the late twentieth and early twenty-first century French context. A list of the abbreviations of texts cited would have been helpful. Marder's book is highly recommended for all who continue to wrestle with the dual legacy of Heidegger's thought and his "great mistakes," without minimizing either.

[1] Peter Trawny, Freedom to Fail: Heidegger's Anarchy, trans. by Alexander Moore and Christopher Turner (Hoboken, N.J.; John Wiley and Sons, 2015).


[2] Martin Heidegger, Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly (Bloomington, Ind.: Indiana University Press, 1988) p. 28.

[3] Ibid. p. 21.

[4] Martin Heidegger, Nature, History, State: 1933-1934, ed. and trans. by Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (London and New York: Bloomsbury Press. 2013).

[5] Franz Rosenzweig, The Star of Redemption, trans. by Barbara E. Galli, Introduction by Elliot R. Wolfson (Madison, WI: University of Wisconsin Press, 2005).