Heidegger's Atheism: The Refusal of a Theological Voice

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Hemming, Laurence Paul, Heidegger's Atheism: The Refusal of a Theological Voice, University of Notre Dame Press, 2002, 327pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0268030588.

Reviewed by Jean Grondin , Universite de Montreal


Engaging, refreshingly independent and at times personal, this book is an honest attempt by a theologian to take up Heidegger’s challenge to theology: how can a thinker who, despite his own Catholic origins, professes a philosophical atheism and emphatically reiterates Nietzsche’s word «God is dead» have anything to say to theologians? While most sympathetic to Heidegger’s thinking and his relevance for the voice of faith, Hemming’s study remains largely free of any «Heideggerizing» (and when it does seem to indulge, the author thankfully apologizes!). Its interest is not biographical either: the nature, evolution and roots of Heidegger’s personal faith (or personal atheism), if there is one to speak of, are not his topic. The author is only concerned with its theological consequences. His basic thesis is straightforward, but by no means original: Heidegger’s atheism, the author argues, must be read as a destruction of the metaphysical God, that is nothing but an idol of subjectivity, and as an opening up of the place for a more divine God. The last words of the book speak of a «holy atheism», from which contemporary theology could only benefit. It is thus an atheism ad majorem Dei gloriam. The «refusal» of a theological voice alluded to in the subtitle refers mainly to Heidegger’s own reluctance to give more precise contours to the more «divine» God he is aiming at or hoping for. Whereas one could read this refusal as a criticism of Heidegger, faulting him, say, for failing to engage more directly with theology (or the Scriptures themselves) in his quest for a more divine God, the author more often than not maintains that Heidegger’s silence is, on the whole, the best way to speak of this unspeakable God. To say what this divine God would amount to would be to fall back into an objectifying and thus ontological notion of God. In other words, the refusal is more eloquent than anything that can be said about God (but what about Revelation?). It is the author’s conviction that Heidegger’s negative theology can best be described as mystical, in continuity with St. Gregory of Nissa, Catherine of Siena and Meister Eckhart (282).

This is all very defensible, but it has (often!) been said before. Unfortunately, the author is quite dismissive of his predecessors, often claiming, with enormous pretension, that «theological appropriations of Heidegger’s have never opened up Heidegger’s thought as a question» (21). For anyone familiar with the theological reception of Heidegger’s work, this claim is outrageous. It is quite inexplicable that the author does not evoke the work of such well-known theologians as Gerhard Ebeling, Eberhard Jüngel or J. B. Lotz, to name but a few, nor the landmark study on the relations between philosophy and theology in the work of Heidegger published by Annemarie Gethmann-Siefert in 1974. Indeed, one would be hard-pressed to find any theology after Heidegger that has not been provoked by his critique of the metaphysical God and his longing for a holier one. The only theologian discussed at any length is Jean-Luc Marion, but here again, the discussion remains uncompromising, accusing Marion of a host of misunderstandings: contrary to what Marion would allege, Heidegger never thought of God as a being (257) and Marion never escapes a notion of being that remains metaphysical (265). Nevertheless, Hemming remains far more indebted to Marion than he acknowledges in that the holier God he is seeking for is not a last ontological principle, and not even a God that exists (?), but a God of love, that requires self-abandoning (and a sacrificium intellectus?). The author hints that this must lead to a (renewed?) Christology, but it remains, understandably, unarticulated in this book. Not a surprising outcome on the part of a Christian theologian, to say the least, but what support can such a Christology find in the work of Heidegger?

The interest of the book lies in its reading of Heidegger’s entire opus out of this silent quest for a non-metaphysical God, taking up, as it were, Gadamer’s indication that Heidegger remained a «God-seeker» throughout his life. This leads the author to a useful relativization of the idea of a caesura, allegedly marked by the turn or Kehre, between two phases in Heidegger’s thinking. «What if there is no later Heidegger?», challengingly asks the author (3). This relativization is also not revolutionary. Authors such as Gadamer and Kisiel have already spoken of a «Kehre before the Kehre». But if there is a Kehre before the Kehre, what is this turn away from, asks Hemming (75)? He reads the Kehre as a turn away from metaphysics and its objectifying understanding of God. He goes to great lengths to demonstrate that this Kehre must not be understood as a biographical turn on Heidegger’s path. Hence his (again) dismissive attitude towards the interpretations of Löwith and Richardson, who would have wrongfully constructed the notion of a biographical Kehre, failing to understand its true historical import. The author gives the impression that this notion of a biographical conversion has been created by Löwith and Richardson and reiterated by every interpreter ever since. The truth of the matter is that it is Heidegger himself who gave credence to this idea of a biographical turn when he wrote and published his Letter on Humanism. It was not invented by Löwith. Furthermore, it has also long been registered in the literature that the Kehre must primarily be understood as a historical turn «in Being». It would have been more felicitous if the author had focused on the recently published texts of the GA that shed new light on the Kehre, among others: the Beiträge, of course, but also the Bremen lectures of 1949 [GA 79], and the small text entitled Rückweg und Kehre [Return and Turn] published in the Jahresgabe der Martin-Heidegger-Gesellschaft in the year 2000. There is perhaps more insight to be gained from these texts, which Heidegger left unpublished (and in part, certainly, because of their theological undertones), than from a rehash of the alleged misunderstandings of Löwith and Richardson in the 50s and 60s.

In sum, if the author has every right to read Heidegger’s «pious» atheism as a «vibrant pedagogy», i.e. as a self-criticism for theologians, it fails to do justice to and acknowledge the critical and diversified reception it has already enjoyed in the theology and philosophy of the last century.