Heidegger's Contributions to Philosophy: Life and the Last God

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Jason Powell, Heidegger's Contributions to Philosophy: Life and the Last God, Continuum, 2007, 155pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826496799.

Reviewed by George Pattison, Christ Church, Oxford


There is a well-known short story by Borges concerning one Pierre Menard, a scholar who spends a lifetime on attempting to translate Don Quixote in such a way, if possible, as to surpass the original. Finally, he succeeds -- succeeds by re-creating, line-for-line and word-for-word, the exact text of the original.

This story comes to mind in connection with Heidegger's work Contributions to Philosophy. Even compared with many of his other works, this is a 'contribution' unique in style, composition and overall effect. How is it possible to do it justice without simply reproducing, line-by-line and word-for-word, the original text? Or, to put the point less extremely: how can we interpret this text without entering so deeply into the thought-world and language of Heidegger that we interpret him exclusively through his own ideas and words? The other pole of interpretation would, of course, be to re-frame Heidegger's questions so as to translate them exhaustively into non-Heideggerian English. But can such a thing be done? On the other hand, and pace Borges, can an interpretation that merely reproduces the original be considered genuinely philosophical? Philosophical interpretation, one imagines, is so far from leaving the original (any original) as it is that it requires a thorough-going critical Auseinandersetzung with the text to be interpreted, in which no key idea or term is left unexamined. In the case of Heidegger, whose work involves such an idiosyncratic use of his own German language, such questions become all the sharper when it is a matter of interpreting him in English.

Jason Powell is certainly aware of these issues, stating at the outset that, rather than merely reproducing Heidegger's thought in 'Translationese', his intention 'is to render Heidegger's thought into an English which is unforced and not merely an indirect translation' (p. viii). Indeed, his ideal reader, far from being a specialist researcher, is someone who is 'seeking to learn about Heidegger's major work for the first time, attracted by the lure of an answer to the "meaning of life", and a philosophical account of God' (p. x). For such a reader, he offers a commentary on a number of key points in Contributions and places the work in the context of Heidegger's development. The question, then, is: does he succeed in producing a work that will help just such a keen but neophyte reader?

There is no doubt that Powell is very familiar with the serpentine ins and outs of his text, and, in a circle of experienced Heidegger interpreters, would have a useful contribution to make. However, I would feel uncomfortable at giving this book to a student coming to Heidegger for the first time. I am also unconvinced that Powell shows us how and why this is a philosophically interesting work, which would also be something that any first-timer would need to think about (and no less relevant to an old-timer).

A basic problem is that he scarcely does justice to issues of translation that, even if they cannot be resolved within the compass of a work such as this, can at least be flagged. For example, I do not find anywhere a discussion of the crucial term found in Heidegger's subtitle: 'Vom Ereignis'. Powell takes the English translators' rendering 'Enownment' without further comment, but given the role of this term not only in this work but throughout Heidegger's later philosophy, this seems to miss a trick. The power of Heidegger's ruminations on language is not in his facility in conjuring of neologisms, but in the way in which he gives new meanings to old words (or, as he would have it, enables us to hear what is originally being said in a word that has become debased and overlooked in the everyday chatter of Dasein). In this case, Ereignis is not a forced piece of terminology (like 'enownment'), but a word you are likely to encounter every day in the newspaper. Moreover 'enownment' entirely obscures the normal sense of event or happening, a meaning that, semantically, points to other key Heideggerian terms and concepts, such as historicity. This link to historicity is explained on p. 66. However, it is hard to say that what is said there will be clear to a reader who does not already have a good sense for what Heidegger is about: 'Ereignis is the thinking-act of entering non-self-hood and pure life, entering the unity of things which is within, which the "personality" that writes the poetry of Hölderlin seems to do in each poem …' (p. 66).

A similar set of issues arises in the case of 'Going-under', introduced at p. 25 and taken up from time to time elsewhere (e.g., p. 66). Not only is there no mention of the rich connotative field of the German original, but no mention is made of its crucial role in the intellectual, moral and cultural movements represented in Nietzsche's Zarathustra, so important to Heidegger.

Or, take the following passage, part of a longer quotation from Contributions to Philosophy:

Language, whether spoken or held in silence, [is] the primary and broadest humanization of beings. So it seems. But it [is] precisely the most originary non-humanization of man as an extant living-being and "subject" and the heretofore -- and thereby the grounding of Da-Sein and of the possibility of the non-humanization of beings. (Quoted on p. 70)

Powell comments: 'The situation described so beautifully here is in no proper sense either in the time, place or word of human, or of normal life while at the same time it welcomes us to realize that while we give human names to things, that naming dis-humanizes us and makes us into agents of be-ing' (p. 70). But it is very hard to see why or how this passage -- in English, at least -- is obviously or unproblematically describable as 'beautiful'. Nor does Powell's gloss really explain it -- let alone demonstrate the kind of critical questioning that might help the reader know what was at stake in accepting or rejecting what Heidegger is saying.

More worryingly, there are passages where Powell either misrepresents or elides difficult questions that are raised by or for Heidegger. Sometimes these are the kinds of questions that are hard to avoid in summarizing the thought of another thinker. Thus, on p. 53 there are some comments about the role of scholastic theology in bringing about the epoch of machination. This is probably a reasonable statement of Heidegger's account -- but it is very far from self-evident whether it is a correct account and it is also unclear whether Powell himself accepts it.

There are also significant equivocations or even errors around two key questions, namely Heidegger's Nazism and his attitude to religion.

With regard to the former, it is said that Heidegger argued that the University 'had to affirm itself against the labour and military services, which were putting humanity at the service of humanity' (pp. 55-6, the point is repeated on pp. 92-3). The key word here is 'against', because, in fact, whilst Heidegger certainly calls for the self-assertion of the University this is as complementary to, not in opposition to, the other component elements of the corporate state. Indeed, it is a central part of his message to the students, that they have a commitment not only to serve knowledge, but also to serve the Volk through labour and the Nation through military service as integral to their lives as university students.

In the case of religion, a 1921 letter to Karl Löwith is quoted in which Heidegger refers to himself as a Christian theologian. Powell comments that 'In his letter he does not insist that he is a wholesale Catholic believer, nevertheless, he is a thinker whose thoughts do not depart from God, and the experiences which he favours are those of a believer' (p. 81). But this is doubly misleading. Firstly, by 1921 Heidegger had already quiet explicitly broken with Catholicism, so there is not even any question of his being a Catholic believer; if he is anything, he is a free (i.e., non-ecclesiastical) Protestant at this point. And, secondly, the letter is used to illuminate Heidegger's position in the mid-1930s. Thus, even while it may be true that in a number of works of the 1920s 'the experiences which he favours are those of a believer', this is far less obviously the case in the 1930s. Indeed, there are passages that are clearly hostile to Christianity in general and theology in particular.

I am sorry not to be able to be more positive about a work so plainly passionate about Heidegger and about the attempt to understand the human condition through engaging with Heidegger's thought. Perhaps the issue is brought to a head in the concluding comments, where Powell writes: 'I am not the first writer to notice that, in order to understand and esteem highly Heidegger's work, one has to become a follower' (p. 129). Although Powell notes the tension between such a claim and the normal conception of philosophy, it does not really do justice either to the issue or to the subject. Why is it not possible to find Heidegger philosophically interesting, provocative, and even important while at the same time being critical of where he fails to live up to his own best insights or keeping an open mind on some of his fundamental claims?